Omniscience: From a Logical Point of View

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Paul Weingartner, Omniscience: From a Logical Point of View, Ontos, 2008, 188pp., $122.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793817.

Reviewed by Daniel J. Hill, University of Liverpool


This peculiar book lives up to its title: it consists of twelve chapters of discussion of various questions related to omniscience set out in the scholastic manner (statement of the question, arguments contra, arguments pro, author's statement pro, and answer to the arguments contra) followed by a final chapter setting out a theory of omniscience. This last chapter is almost wholly formal: it consists of 150 theorems derived from 8 axioms, 25 definitions, and some sub-definitions. Occasionally the theorems are explained in (rather ropey) English. This review will concentrate on the final chapter, as this is where the meat of the author's argument lies.

The theory states that: God is omniscient iff he has sound knowledge, complete knowledge, necessary knowledge, and tenseless knowledge. The first thing to note is that the definition is phrased for God in particular, rather than beings in general, which seems unnecessary, and might rule out more than it should, since some Orthodox Christians believe that in the next life all the blessed will be omniscient.

Let us now look at each individual element of the definition in turn.

'Sound knowledge' means that everything that God knows is true. Again, it seems unnecessary to define this in terms of God in particular rather than for everything in general -- surely knowledge implies truth whoever is the subject? In fact, it seems unnecessary to include this at all, since soundness is already implicit in the word 'knowledge'.

'Complete knowledge' for Weingartner denotes knowledge of the 'theorems' about God himself, logic and mathematics, and creation. The term 'theorems' is a confusing one here, since Weingartner himself glosses it as 'states of affairs': it is hard to see that all the states of affairs about creation are theorems in the usual sense of 'theorems' and omniscience should certainly cover more than theorems in the usual sense. Secondly, it is unclear that Weingartner's list is really comprehensive enough to denote 'complete knowledge' -- what about knowledge of ethical truths or aesthetic truths or metaphysical truths, for example? Of course, many philosophers deny that there are such, but surely a definition of 'omniscience' should not be based on such a view? It is not even clear that such a truth as 'no married man is a bachelor' is a logical truth rather than a conceptual one. And what about the conjunction of a logical truth with one about creation (e.g. '2 + 2 = 4 and Paris is the capital of France') or their disjunction ('2 + 2 = 4 or Paris is the capital of France')? These would not appear to fit neatly into any of the three categories. Here Weingartner pays the price for not having as part of his definition a clause saying that God knows all truths (rejected on p. 137 and p. 165). Finally, if one has a broad understanding of 'theorem' or 'state of affairs' God's knowledge of creation will be subsumed under his knowledge of himself, for his knowing that I exist, say, will be included in his knowledge that he wills to create me and that his will is irresistible. (This argument might not extend to God's middle knowledge, if he has such, but then his middle knowledge also finds no place in Weingartner's scheme.)

'Necessary knowledge' means that if God knows something he necessarily knows it. It is never quite clear exactly what Weingartner means here. On pp. 20-21 he offers two possible interpretations of 'possible' (and, hence, 'necessary') in this context: 'with the help of time' (i.e. 'possibly' means 'at some time' and 'necessary' means 'at all times'), and with respect to 'the domain of knowledge'. It is hard to know quite what this last means: normally 'epistemically possible' means 'consistent with what is known', but in that case 'necessary knowledge' is pleonastic. Weingartner mentions that Aquinas held the view that all God's knowledge is necessary, but Aquinas in fact makes a distinction:

Hence also this proposition, 'Everything known by God must necessarily be' is usually distinguished; for this may refer to the thing, or to the saying. If it refers to the thing, it is divided and false; for the sense is 'Everything which God knows is necessary'. If understood of the saying, it is composite and true; for the sense is 'This proposition, "that which is known by God is", is necessary'. (Summa Theologiae, Ia.Q14.a13.ad3)

Weingartner does not avail himself of this distinction, however; in fact, he tries to rebut the argument that the necessity of God's knowledge is inconsistent with human freedom by denying that the fact that God doesn't know something implies that he necessarily doesn't know it (p. 132). Quite how this denial is supposed to defuse the problem is obscure: since Weingartner affirms that 'God knows the obtaining of every contingent future event' (p. 117; defended by postulating God's atemporality on pp. 122-127) God either knows that Jones will mow his lawn or knows that it won't be the case that Jones will mow his lawn. Whichever piece of knowledge he has will be necessary, and so the problem has not been dissolved. Weingartner does not think God's atemporality straightaway solves the problem of knowledge of future contingents, because for him 'necessary' in this context does not refer to the temporal notion of accidental necessity (cf. p. 116, fn 133). Weingartner's non-standard understanding of necessity turns up again in his definition of God's knowledge about creation in which he states that God's knowledge about creation is both necessary and of contingent truths (p. 140).

To turn to the last part of Weingartner's definition of 'omniscience', 'tenseless knowledge' means not that God's knowledge is of tenseless propositions, but that it is not the case that God has his knowledge at times. It is unclear why this is a necessary part of the definition; why would a theory that presented God as having sound, complete, and necessary knowledge but that did not present God as having tenseless knowledge (either through postulating an everlasting God or through simply being agnostic on this question) not thereby be presenting an omniscient God? (The reply that God is necessarily timeless is not to the point here: it is the concept of God's omniscience that is in view, and the question of whether this concept depends on the concept of God's timelessness.)

Finally on this definition, let us consider whether the four elements of sound knowledge, complete knowledge, necessary knowledge, and tenseless knowledge are sufficient for omniscience, as Weingartner asserts. Apart from the problems raised above, it should also be noted that it is not a stated requirement for God to be omniscient that he have no false beliefs, for Weingartner. While one can reply that, strictly, this is the property of infallibility rather than that of omniscience, surely the fact of God's having no false beliefs should at least be discussed somewhere? It might be thought that the insistence that God's knowledge is necessary knowledge deals with this, but, in fact, this allows for God to believe necessarily false propositions such as that 2 + 2 = 5. Weingartner does define 'logically (or deductively) infallible' (p. 161, D17), but in such a way that he is actually defining 'logically (or deductively) omniscient', i.e. that 'God knows all the logical consequences of what he knows' (p. 161); this still allows that God might also have false beliefs.

Weingartner also throws in for good measure a definition of 'omnipotence': God is omnipotent iff it's both the case that if God wills a proposition he knows it and the case that God can will all and only those propositions that are self-consistent and consistent with God's essence and commands. Again, we begin by noting that omnipotence is defined only for God rather than more generally.

Let us now proceed to the first clause of the definiens. 'If God wills a proposition he knows it' seems a rather self-conscious way to put the point: why not just say that if God wills a proposition it is true? Weingartner's formulation links omnipotence to omniscience in an unnecessary way. Also, Weingartner uses only the material conditional here, but this seems insufficient, given that there are infinitely many propositions that God does not actually will but that he might have willed. Do we not want to say that it is part of the concept of omnipotence that if God were to will a proposition that proposition would be true? This itself raises further problems, of course: what if God, per impossibile, were to will that I freely do something?

Weingartner's use of the word 'will' is also non-standard: 'God can will something of himself (his goodness or his existence) but he cannot cause it' (p. 158). Weingartner does not explain what it then means to say that God wills his own existence or his own goodness; elsewhere he makes it clear that he normally thinks that God's willing brings about what is willed in some way ('expressions like "God wills that man obeys his ten commandments" are not formulated in a correct way since [ … ] if God wills that, then man will always obey his ten commandments; but this is not the case, as we know' (p. 157)). Weingartner does explain what he means by 'causes': 'God causes that p iff p belongs to the theorems of his creation and God wills that p' (p. 158). This may be unduly restrictive: can God not cause it to be the case that he is thinking of himself or loving himself? Surely an argument is owed here.

Regarding the second clause of the definiens, the restriction of the scope of God's omnipotence to propositions that are consistent with God's essence and commands opens the door, if generalized, to the famous McEar problem. The problem is that the definition is too weak in that God's essence could, for all we are told here, restrict the set of propositions over which God has power far beyond the intuitive scope of 'omnipotence'. The point is clearer with the generalized definition, which says that something is omnipotent iff it has the power to make true any proposition consistent with its essence and commands. Imagine a being called 'McEar', whose essence is such that it is impossible for him to do anything other than scratch his ear and actions included in that action (raising his arm, etc.). On this definition if McEar can scratch his ear he is omnipotent, his inability to create a universe notwithstanding. Yet surely this is wrong; hence the generalized definition is too weak. Similarly, imagine a being called 'McCommand' who has the power, for exactly one possible world, successfully to command that that world be actual. McCommand commands that this world be actual, and it is. McCommand is intuitively not omnipotent, since for any other possible world he lacks the power to command that it be actual. The problem is that McCommand turns out to be omnipotent on the definition provided by Weingartner, since, once he has commanded that the possible world be actual, all propositions false in that world are then inconsistent with his commands, and thus outside the purview of the definition. (It may be objected that McCommand is omnipotent only after his successful command that the possible world be actual. This is true, but not to the point. In any case, one could adapt the example to feature Essential McCommand, who, necessarily, as soon as he exists, commands that this possible world be actual. If it be replied that McCommand and Essential McCommand are both part of the possible world whose actuality they command, one can tinker with the example to get a being that commands that the rest of the possible world be actual, and for whom it is included in his essence that he be part of the bit of the possible world involving him. Besides, in that case wouldn't God be part of the possible world whose actuality he commands?)

Weingartner also proposes a definition of what it is for God to be all good (D6, p. 159): God is all good iff God is 'normative and volitive consistent' (p. 157) and everything that he wills is good. Both directions of this definition (which, once more, is defined for God in particular rather than beings in general) seem unsatisfactory: first, it might well be asking too much that everything that God wills is good -- why would it prevent God's being good if he willed something morally neutral? For example, if God has willed that my hair is blond and that is a morally neutral fact, does that mean that God is not all good? As regards the other direction of the biconditional, it would seem to allow that God might still be all good if he consistently did not will the best option available to him as long as the option he did will was good. Intuitively, however, we want the definition of 'all good' to imply that God wills the best when there is such.

Even the formalization is not impeccable: T42 and T43, for example, lack the final bracket, and the justification for the final theorem, T150, should include 'T140'. Also, the reader is painfully aware during the non-formal sections of the book that English is not Weingartner's first language: the first chapter is titled 'Whether everything is true what God knows', for example.

All in all, this idiosyncratic volume is an interesting but failed attempt to provide a formal theory of omniscience.