On Determining What There Is: The Identity of Ontological Categories in Aquinas, Scotus, and Lowe

Placeholder book cover

Paul Symington, On Determining What There Is: The Identity of Ontological Categories in Aquinas, Scotus, and Lowe, Ontos, 2010, 172pp., €79.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380972.

Reviewed by Andrew W. Arlig, Brooklyn College, CUNY


Thomas Aquinas thinks that there are ten and only ten wholly distinct, basic types of beings. That is, the list of ten categories given by Aristotle is exhaustive, and no category overlaps with or reduces to any other category. Aquinas makes some claims which suggest that the list of the Aristotelian categories can be justified by examining the different ways in which something is predicated of another. But precisely how Aquinas thinks that this can be done is not entirely clear. In this book, Paul Symington offers a new interpretation of Aquinas's proposed system of deriving and justifying the ten Aristotelian categories. Moreover, Symington claims that Aquinas's method can be fruitfully adapted to contemporary discussions of the categories.

After a brief introductory chapter, Symington presents a critique of earlier presentations of Aquinas's derivation of the ten categories and then offers a new interpretation of Aquinas's derivation (chapter 1). Specifically, in Symington's view, earlier interpreters (most notably John Wippel) have failed to appreciate the way in which Aquinas utilizes the different senses in which one thing can be predicated per se of another thing. With this new interpretation established, Symington then turns to Duns Scotus's critique of any system of derivation which starts from facts about linguistic predication and concludes with claims about being (chapter 2). After surveying Scotus's arguments against this kind of approach, Symington returns to Aquinas, presents yet another reconstruction of Aquinas's method, and then answers Scotus on Aquinas's behalf (chapter 3). Finally, Symington shifts to the contemporary debate over the derivation of categories (chapter 4). He focuses on the four category scheme articulated by E. J. Lowe. He examines the method that Lowe uses to derive his four categories and then demonstrates how Aquinas's method can be used to derive the same four categories. Symington then argues that Aquinas's method of derivation is superior to Lowe's, since it avoids a key difficulty that Lowe's theory faces.

I will say very little about Symington's dispute with previous interpreters of Aquinas. Symington's interpretation is a contender for understanding Aquinas's method of derivation, provided that Symington is right that Aquinas intends to ultimately establish the ten categories by appealing to modes of predication. Below, I will question whether this proviso is true.

I was puzzled that Symington provides two more or less independent presentations of Aquinas's method. The first appears after he has surveyed previous contemporary scholarship on Aquinas's method (chapter 1); the second is given right before he responds to Scotus's critique (chapter 3). (In fact, I would recommend that readers begin with Symington's second presentation of Aquinas's method for deriving the categories [pp. 92-109]. Here Symington finally steps back and examines Aquinas's underlying assumptions about being, which sheds some much needed light on Aquinas's method.) This duplication is one of many symptoms of a deeper problem with this book. Symington's work is not an integrated whole. Rather, it appears to be a collection of related papers, perhaps originally drawn from a more unified dissertation, which have been hurriedly pieced back together. This lack of integrity manifests itself in other ways which make this book more difficult to read than it should be.

Clearly, Symington wants this book to appeal not only to specialists in medieval philosophy but also to contemporary metaphysicians. Unfortunately, I suspect that many contemporary metaphysicians will find chapters 1 through 3 a bit daunting. No real effort is made to introduce readers to the jungle of Aristotelian distinctions at work. For example, we have terms of "first" and "second intention"; we have a distinction between not only per se and per accidens being, but also per se and secundum se being. We are told that Aquinas distinguishes between four kinds of per se predication, three of which are relevant for deriving categories. (To make matters more confusing, in chapter 4 the modes of predication that are deemed to be important are reduced to two.) It is only once we reach chapter 4 that Symington stops and attempts to translate medieval distinctions into a contemporary idiom (pp. 132-33). But by this point, I suspect that many a contemporary metaphysician will have given up on the book.

In general, the introduction misses several opportunities to contextualize the highly specific and highly technical proceedings in the main parts of the book. We get the history of interpretation and debate over Aristotle's categories in fits and starts. For instance, we do not learn until chapter 2 -- after we have looked at Aquinas -- that there was a debate among the early medieval schools over whether the categories were words, concepts, or things (p. 51). Only a modest effort is made to characterize the impact that Aquinas's theory had on the thirteenth-century thinkers between Aquinas and Scotus. While it is true that the period between Aquinas and Scotus requires further study, we do know of some developments that are crucial for understanding what Scotus was doing when he criticized any and all attempts to derive the categories of being from predication.

Instead, the introductory chapter is mostly an ahistorical and highly general survey of categories as such. But even this has its problems. We are told that there are numerous issues pertaining to categories. Indeed, we get several lists of them (see pp. 3-4, p. 7, and p. 11). But these questions are often raised only to be ignored. For example, there is the question whether categories are things, and if so, what sort of things they are. (Are they Platonic archetypes, immanent universals, sets, collections of particulars, or something else?) It is fairly clear that all three protagonists in this book think that categories are items or features of mind-independent reality. But while there are some passing remarks about Lowe's position (see, e.g., p. 158), there is no prominent statement of Aquinas's or Scotus's view on what kind of thing a category is. Symington asserts that all three protagonists are Aristotelian realists, but anyone at all familiar with this family of theories knows that the term "Aristotelian" is often liberally applied.

No real effort is made to justify the focus on realism and, specifically, Aquinas's version of Aristotelian realism. In the end, this is a book about Aquinas's theory of the categories; Lowe and Scotus turn out to be foils. However, it would be nice to see some motivation for Aristotelian realism, especially since Symington makes no secret of his allegiance to the approach favored by Aquinas. It is also odd that Symington altogether ignores other medieval positions on the categories, such as, most glaringly, the reductivist "Aristotelian" position of Ockham. Like Aquinas, Scotus claims that there are ten and only ten categories, but Scotus thinks that this fact cannot be proved. In short, it seems that we are witnessing an internecine feud and that we are not going to get a thorough vetting of Aquinas's position.

It should be appreciated that Scotus is attacking a family of methods for deriving the categories from facts about predication, because I think this truth lessens the impact of Symington's defense of Aquinas from Scotus's assault. I agree with Symington that, on the whole, Scotus's specific arguments against this family of methods fail to undermine Aquinas's position. But they fail to do much harm to Aquinas's theory because Scotus seems to be aiming his arguments at positions advocated by Scotus's near contemporaries. Many of these theories were perhaps inspired by Aquinas's method of deriving the categories from modes of predication, but the targeted theories seem to have started from different assumptions about the nature of predication and the nature of being itself. We learn that Aquinas holds an "inherence" theory of predication, whereas Scotus assumes that his targets subscribe to an "identity" theory. Aquinas thinks that something's essence must be distinguished from its existence; Scotus believes that they are one and the same. Scotus's criticisms also rely on a theory of language and concepts that is significantly distinct from (and arguably much more refined than) Aquinas's corresponding theories.

Hence, as Symington presents them, Aquinas and Scotus spend much of their time talking past one another. Moreover, when Symington does have the chance to find a proper forum in which Scotus and Aquinas might clash, he balks. For instance, he never tries to adjudicate between the different conceptions of being. When the opportunity arises to challenge the identity theory of predication, Symington merely notes that the theory is considered to be defunct by some thinkers (i.e., Geach) on logical grounds (p. 119).

It is troubling that Aquinas is allowed to "win" this clash with Scotus, even though Aquinas's position has not been subjected to much serious criticism. Despite my previous concession about the weakness of Scotus's actual arguments, Scotus is right to be skeptical of any method which attempts to establish and justify ontological claims by appealing to linguistic or logical facts.

Symington's Aquinas and Scotus both consider predication to be a linguistic (or equivalently, for our purposes, mental) relation between terms (or concepts). Hence, if Symington is right, Aquinas thinks that the categories are to be individuated and justified by examining the ways in which one term is related to another. However, Aquinas never actually works through the derivation of all ten categories using this method, a fact that Symington concedes is "unfortunate" (p. 44). Later, he tells us that the derivation of the full list of categories is beyond the scope of his investigation (p. 122). This is a striking admission, given that Aquinas's method is supposed to be a viable way of individuating all ten categories. Are we not entitled to see how the full derivation will proceed? It does not help to learn that, in addition to the list of ten Aristotelian categories, Aquinas's method can be used to derive a different set of four categories (chap. 4).

Even if we stick with the categories that have been derived (Substance, Quantity, Quality, and Relative), there is still an issue that must be addressed. It is an issue that Scotus understood, even if he got distracted by certain details: can facts about the relationship between words give us any definitive insight into the structure of things? Consider three syntactically similar sentences:

(1) "Socrates is tall."

(2) "Socrates is pale."

(3) "Socrates is blind."

For Aquinas, the first two predicates name items that fall under the categories of Quantity and Quality, respectively. The third does not. "Blind" names a lack or privation. Many philosophers, both medieval and modern, deny that lacks or privations are things, let alone that there is a category Privation. But nothing about the nature of the terms qua terms seems to indicate that "tall" and "pale" name instances of categories whereas "blind" does not. Syntactically, the terms function in the same way. Symington's reply is that Aquinas's method of derivation only establishes "an exhaustive list of non-reducible modes of being" (p. 127). The method will not tell us that some specific predicate, such as "blind", fails to name a form that is actualized in a substance. It only will tell us that if "blind" named a form, that form would belong to the category of Quality.

Privations do not trouble Symington because the definitions of privations must always appeal to positive attributes, and it is supposedly differences between the modes of predication of positive attributes, such as "tall" and "pale", which establish the non-reducible modes of being. But rebuttals of this sort make it all the more evident that the modes of predication are not the true principles of individuation for the categories. On Symington's picture, we must always ultimately appeal to definitions. A predicate like "tall" is distinct from a substantial predicate because the definition of tall is not present in the definition of the subject. "Pale" is determined to not be a substantial predicate in a similar fashion. Sentences (1) and (2) signify distinct non-substantial categories because "tall" can be a subject for another per se predication, such as "this tall thing is white", whereas "pale" cannot be the subject of a per se predication. Definitions, however, are linguistic representations of essences. Some term is in a definition because the referent of that term is a cause of the being of the thing referred to by the definiendum. The causal relationships between different essences determine the differences which are represented or "expressed" by the rules that dictate what term may be predicated of another term (see p. 120 and p. 156). Hence, the real principles of individuation of the categories are the causal relationships that obtain between different essences. It is misleading, then, to claim that the modes of predication are what individuate and justify the distinctions between categories.

Interestingly, if we look back to Aquinas's texts, it is not obvious that the categories are established by the modes of predication. For example, in his commentary on the Physics, Aquinas says the following:

It should be understood that being (ens) is divided into ten predicaments (praedicamenta), not univocally (as a genus is into its species), but with respect to distinct modes of existing (essendi). Now, the modes of existing are proportional [i.e. bear a likeness] to the modes of predicating. For when we predicate something of something else, we say that this is that (hoc esse illud). Hence, the ten genera of being are called the ten predicaments. (In Phys., book 3, lectio 5, n. 322)

What I see here is not a claim that the categories (the "predicaments") are derived from modes of predication. Rather, we get an explanation of the reason why Aristotle calls the basic genera of being categories. Granted, we also get the claim that the modes of predication are comparable to the modes of existing. But this is a far cry from the claim that one can derive the categories from the modes of predication. As Aquinas proceeds to discuss the modes of predication and the categories in the remaining portion of this excursus in the Physics commentary, it appears that the modes of existing are doing the actual work.

In his presentation and defense of Aquinas, Symington emphasizes the role that the modes of predication play in establishing the categories. When he turns to Lowe's derivation of categories, he insists that logical facts "can be examined in order to establish aspects of reality, although the correspondence between logic and reality is not perfectly isomorphic" (p. 144). Symington contrasts his stance with Lowe's. Lowe is much more skeptical of the prospect of establishing ontological claims by appealing to linguistic and logical facts. Even after reading this book, I find myself leaning toward Lowe's position.