On Folk Epistemology: How We Think and Talk about Knowledge

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Mikkel Gerken, On Folk Epistemology: How We Think and Talk about Knowledge, Oxford, 2017, 332 pp., $60.00, ISBN 9780198803454.

Reviewed by James R. Beebe, University at Buffalo


In this excellent and thought-provoking book, Mikkel Gerken articulates and applies a methodological framework for thinking about the empirical study of folk epistemology. Gerken brings together (i) contemporary debates in epistemology about the nature of knowledge, skepticism, contextualism, knowledge-first epistemology, pragmatic encroachment, norms of action and assertion, and much else with (ii) empirical research on folk epistemology and (iii) broader psychological and linguistic investigations into the nature of human cognition in more sophisticated detail than any other work in print. The book will be of interest not only to epistemologists of all stripes and experimental philosophers who study folk epistemology but also to anyone interested in understanding what a philosophically astute, empirically informed engagement with the scientific study of mental state attributions can look like.

Gerken's central theme is that the broad picture of human cognition as cost-minimizing information processing that has developed within cognitive science during the last half century means that folk epistemic assessments are likely to be boundedly rational, based upon cognitive and communicative heuristics, and thus biased in systematic and predictable ways. Gerken examines the implications of heuristically driven epistemological judgments being based upon processing only a limited portion of the evidence available and relying upon merely 'good enough representations' that involve trade-offs between accuracy and efficiency. We know from research in cognitive and social psychology, behavioral economics, decision theory, and other fields that heuristics, biases, and satisficing are common features of human cognition. Yet these ideas have not been fully developed and applied to the empirical study of folk epistemology until now. Many will question the particular theses Gerken defends about which epistemic assessments are biased due to this heuristic or that cognitive limitation, but his general methodological approach will be difficult to reject or ignore.

Gerken uses his view of epistemic cognition as boundedly rational, heuristically driven cognition to explain a variety of empirical findings, such as our inclination to deny that someone knows that p in the face of a salient alternative, q, and why knowledge norms of action and assertion seem plausible. To explain the salient alternative effect, he (p. 116ff.) articulates an 'epistemic focal bias' account of the psychology of knowledge ascriptions, according to which epistemically irrelevant alternatives can seem relevant when they are made contextually salient or the epistemic resources for ruling out epistemically relevant alternatives are not in focus. For epistemic norms of action, Gerken argues that if a conversation is focused on the question of whether someone should act on a given belief, ascribing knowledge will often fulfill the directive function of recommending in favor of or against acting on the belief. However, Gerken cautions against hastily inferring from this that knowledge is the norm of action. The fact that the degree of warrant necessary for S's knowing that p will often seem to be sufficient for the epistemic permissibility of S's acting on the belief that p may only represent a regularity that holds for the most part rather than an epistemic norm that applies in all cases (p. 143). And the fact that the concept of knowledge comes to mind quite readily and easily when making epistemic assessments of actions may only mean that more fine-grained and often more accurate assessments are simply more difficult to conceptualize or articulate. Thus, Gerken takes knowledge norms of action and assertion to represent useful, easy to apply rules of thumb rather than the sober truth of how we should think about epistemic norms.

Philosophers working in areas such as philosophy of science, social and political philosophy, applied ethics, or philosophy of mind have long been accustomed to the need for empirical studies to inform their philosophical theorizing. In other domains where being empirically well informed has not been the traditional norm (e.g., epistemology, philosophy of language), one often finds two simplistic approaches to (potentially relevant) empirical data. On the one hand, there is a dismissive approach that denies empirical studies any relevance for philosophical theorizing. At the other extreme is the view that takes philosophical theorizing to be nothing more than 'fitting the curve' to observed patterns of intuitive judgments (p. 60). These two approaches represent more than merely ideal types, since they can often be observed in their pure, unqualified forms. Gerken's methodological approach, however, differs from each of them in interesting and significant ways. Some slogans that represent Gerken's metaphilosophical perspective include "Our folk epistemological practices should inform epistemology but folk epistemology should not rule epistemology" (p. 3) and "Epistemology without folk epistemology is empty. Folk epistemology without epistemology is biased" (p. 294).

Gerken begins from the fact that epistemic assessments play important roles in our social lives. For example, he writes:

To assert that these propositions are known by oneself or someone else is to do something significant and distinctive with one's words. The proposition is now given a special status. Moreover, we can give someone a stamp of social approval by ascribing knowledge to her. Indeed, phrases such as 'she is in the know' and 'she knows what she is talking about' indicate that knowledge ascriptions are central to many of the social scripts that govern our interactions. (p. 1)

However, as already noted, Gerken does not think that folk epistemology should rule epistemological theorizing because the former will be biased in systematic ways. Gerken contrasts his 'equilibristic' approach with what Keith DeRose (2009, p. 153) calls 'the methodology of the straightforward,' which the latter describes as taking "very seriously the simple positive and negative claims speakers make utilizing the piece of language being studied, and puts a very high priority on making those natural and appropriate straightforward uses come out true" but which places relatively little emphasis on speakers' metalinguistic claims and comparative judgments across cases. Gerken endorses an approach that places less emphasis on single case judgments, more emphasis on comparative judgments across cases, and allows folk epistemology and epistemological theory to be "mutually illuminating" (p. 296).

The distinctive features of Gerken's methodological approach can be best appreciated if we consider how epistemologists should react when it is observed that folk judgments either diverge or fail to diverge from what traditional epistemological theory says is correct. When the folk judge that subjects in Gettier cases have knowledge (e.g., Starmans and Friedman 2012), a certain kind of experimental philosopher will claim that a widely accepted epistemological dogma has been overthrown, while armchair epistemologists who dismiss the relevance of empirical findings will take this result to support their methodological stance. Gerken agrees with the latter group to a certain extent, noting that in response to the discovery of the conjunction fallacy, "it would be misguided to suggest that Kahneman and Tversky should have called up the department of mathematics to announce that the conjunction rule had been empirically falsified" (p. 100). However, the most interesting case to consider is one where folk judgments align with the expert consensus in epistemology. In such a case, one does not expect to find either experimental philosophers or armchair epistemologists claiming that the agreed upon epistemic principle should be discarded. Yet, that is precisely what Gerken does from time to time. For example, even though empirical studies and philosophical reflection have shown that knowledge norms of action and assertion have a great deal of intuitive plausibility, Gerken claims their plausibility stems from the fact that they are "cognitively cheap and reasonably accurate folk epistemological heuristic[s]" (p. 149). And he argues that turning knowing that p into a necessary and/or sufficient condition for the epistemic permissibility of asserting that p or acting on (the belief that) p is a case of overgeneralizing from paradigmatic cases (p. 87).

Gerken is not always skeptical of cases where the folk and experts agree. But he does think that we should always consider what role cognitive and communicative heuristics might play in making certain kinds of epistemic assessments seem felicitous. Many philosophers bring in psychological explanations only to explain (or explain away) unexpected patterns of judgments or behavior -- often those that conflict with some preferred philosophical perspective. Gerken, however, thinks that psychological explanations should be concerned with all of epistemic assessments -- expected, unexpected, untutored, or trained. And yet he maintains:

In fact, one of the key methodological theses that I will argue for is that empirical research on folk epistemology depends on epistemological theorizing. Without a considerable theoretical grasp of what knowledge is, we would be unable to properly assess empirical findings. So, while we should not uncritically rely on judgments about cases, we should -- indeed must -- critically rely on judgments about cases. Doing so requires plenty of empirically informed reflection, which is best conducted from the armchair. Thus, I do not use empirical results in an ideological attempt to naturalize epistemology beyond recognition. (p. 2)

Gerken's equilibristic methodology thus includes a thoroughgoing commitment to psychological explanation at every level and an equally strong commitment to construct such explanations on a foundation of philosophical reflection. I expect his endeavor to explain a wide variety of intuitive epistemic assessments by appealing to cognitive and communicative heuristics to have a lasting discipline-shaping impact on the empirical study of folk epistemology.

In addition to developing a broad methodological approach for thinking about the empirical study of folk epistemology, Gerken also defends a variety of specific theses in epistemology. The core of his epistemological view is a form of strict purist invariantism with regard to knowledge. The view is invariantist because it denies that the content of uses of 'knows' (and its cognates) depend upon conversational factors, and it is purist because it denies that knowing that p depends upon practical factors associated with p. Gerken contends that degree of warrant required for action and assertion vary with context but that the truth conditions for knowledge ascriptions do not. He argues that we do not need to accept non-traditional accounts of the truth conditions for 'S knows that p' offered by contextualists and pragmatic encroacher because ordinary pragmatic resources can explain the relevant variability in epistemic assessments just as well (p. 207, et passim).

The broader set of views that Gerken defends includes not only the rejection of contextualism and pragmatic encroachment but also the rejection of skepticism, epistemic internalism, factive norms of action and assertion, knowledge-first epistemology, and (although he doesn't place much emphasis of this) the closure principle for knowledge. This is not a package of epistemological views that initially strikes me as very plausible. However, I found the arguments that Gerken provides for each component of his view to be interesting and more persuasive than I would have liked them to be. I suspect that many other readers will have a similar experience. They will find that Gerken's book -- like Gerken himself -- is extremely engaging, challenging, and a pleasure to argue with.

One area where I expect philosophers to press Gerken concerns the number of times he appeals to cognitive and communicative biases to explain findings that represent challenges for his strict purist invariantism. When individuals refrain from attributing knowledge after skeptical alternatives have been made salient, Gerken claims this represents a false negative that results from failing to distinguish between salience and epistemic relevance. When people refrain from attributing knowledge in high stakes situations, he claims this, too, is a false negative -- one that results in part from failing to realize that even though the warrant demand for knowledge frequently coincides with the warrant demand for action, it does not always do so. When conversations bring different alternatives into and out of focus, and this affects individuals' willingness to attribute or deny knowledge, Gerken claims this, too, is a mistake. When we deny knowledge to those who are unable to articulate the epistemic grounds for their beliefs, Gerken maintains this will often be a mistake that arises from a failure to recognize that certain conversational settings bring with them justificatory demands that do not correspond to the justificatory demands on knowledge. When we observe that knowledge ascriptions are often used to provide assurance, identify reliable informants, stop inquiry, direct action, or honor or blame informants (p. 178ff.), and we begin to think that these functions may have something to do with what knowledge is, Gerken will chide us for failing to recognize that "knowledge ascriptions are often used as communicative heuristics, which are effective, albeit inaccurate, ways of getting complex epistemic points across" (p. 4). And as we have already seen, he contends that the fairly widespread preference for knowledge norms of action and assertion stems from satisficing and overgeneralizing from paradigmatic cases.

In response to all of this, I expect some critics to ask, "If you admit there are lots of findings that are inconsistent with your view, and each challenge requires a slightly different explanation for why it fails to undermine your view, at some point you should consider the possibility that maybe the reason there are so many things that are inconsistent with your view is because it's wrong." Although I expect this line of response to be tempting to some, Gerken's many arguments against competing views will make it difficult to carry through. In particular, he articulates what he calls 'Pandora's dilemma' (ch. 9) for those who wish to let pragmatic factors creep into the truth-determining conditions on knowledge ascriptions. Once some favored pragmatic factors are allowed in, Gerken argues it will be difficult to keep out a host of other pragmatic factors that epistemological impurists would not want to determine the truth values of knowledge ascriptions. Nevertheless, the fact remains that there are a number of moving parts in his perspective, and I expect the number of biases and cognitive limitations to which he appeals to be a source of criticism in the philosophical discussion of his book that ensues.

At several points, Gerken argues that we should prefer his traditional account of the truth conditions for 'S knows that p,' together with his flotilla of hypothesized biases and pragmatic explanations, because he can explain the relevant phenomena just as well as theories that incorporate factors that have not traditionally been taken to determine the truth values of knowledge ascriptions. Given their comparable explanatory merits, Gerken claims we should prefer his more traditional approach. However, in the history of science, when simpler, less traditional theories are pitted against more complex, more traditional ones, and both are taken to explain the relevant phenomena equally well, simplicity often seems to trump conservatism. Moreover, when he appeals to theoretical conservatism in this fashion as a reason to prefer his view, I believe that he sells himself too short. Gerken takes great care -- perhaps a bit too much care at times -- to explain how the various heuristics, biases, and pragmatic factors to which he appeals are grounded in an array of empirical research and are not simply post hoc rationalizations for his preferred perspective. And he supplements these appeals with insightful philosophical arguments against competing epistemological theories. Thus, I think it would be dialectically more effective (if less modest) if Gerken did not grant the explanatory comparability of his views with the opposing views.

When I began reading this book, I was concerned about the fact that the empirical study of folk epistemology was still rather new and that there was not a great deal of data on each of the effects that Gerken wants to analyze. Even though I think he leans a bit too heavily at times on some slender reeds of data, I came to realize that the dialectical and interpretative situation with regard to folk epistemology is now richer and more likely to include better theories by having Gerken's account on the table than it would have been if everyone shared my reticence to theorize about certain aspects of folk epistemology. This carefully crafted book will raise the level of discussion and theorizing about folk epistemology going forward. It is a must read for anyone interested in thinking about folk epistemology.


DeRose, K. (2009). The Case for Contextualism. Oxford University Press.

Starmans, C., and Friedman, O. (2012). "The Folk Conception of Knowledge." Cognition, 124: 272-83.