On the Boundaries of Theological Tolerance

Placeholder book cover

al-Ghazali, Abu Hamid, On the Boundaries of Theological Tolerance, translated by Sherman A. Jackson, Oxford, 172pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195797914.

Reviewed by David Burrell, University of Notre Dame


This translation of al-Ghazali’s adroit way of addressing heresy-hunters in Islam, as well as those Muslims who would place other-believers outside the pale, could not come at a better time. The translator acknowledges that Richard McCarthy had already appended a translation of this work of Ghazali’s to his study and translation of Ghazali’s “autobiography” or personal testimony, under the title Freedom and Fulfillment (Boston: Twayne, 1980), re-issued in 2002 by Fons Vitae (Louisville, KY) as Al-Ghazali: Deliverance from Error. Yet Sherman is doubtless correct in surmising that “it was not [McCarthy’s] intention to produce a reliable scholarly translation of Faysal,” but rather to provide “his reader with additional insight into the breadth and style of Ghazali’s thought” (xiii). Sherman, however, has accomplished both by offering a superb translation with a two-part introduction of eighty pages which first brings theological issues into focus and then addresses the historical context of the document. Part one clearly and astutely addresses the polarities endemic to theological inquiry in any tradition: “between tolerance and exclusivity,” “between religion and history,” “between traditionalism and rationalism,” and between “orthodoxy and heresy.” What distinguishes this section is the way the author and critic shows how such broad tendencies face any theological investigation and shape its spirit. He takes the measure of modern western assessment of Islamic theology, employing examples as well from Christian theology (notably, Hartshorne’s introduction of “process theology”), and makes particularly insightful use of the Ghanian Kwame Gyeke’s Tradition and Modernity: Philosophical Reflections on the African Experience (Oxford: Oxford University Press,1997).

Part two locates this tightly focused work in the context of Ghazali’s opus magnum : Ihya Ulum ad-Din [“Revivifying Religious Learning”], going on to reconstruct the context in which Ghazali was called upon to assess heterodox tendencies in Islam itself, notably the influential ’Abd al-Qahir al-Baghdadi, who would brand anyone outside “his narrow circle of Ash’arite ’orthodoxy’“ with the charge of unbelief [kufr] (41). So with the standing opposition between Mu’taziiites and the followers of al-Ash’ari as the background, and ’Abd al-Qahir’s narrow sensibilities the foreground, Sherman assesses this work’s primary goal: “to defend the community against a veritable cyclone of charges and counter-charges of Unbelief” (40). He further specifies: “The primary target is the extremists, who refuse to recognize any theological interpretation other than their own. The secondary target is the Cryto-infidels … who hide behind their figurative interpretation [ta’wil] in order to conceal their opposition to the religion of the Prophet” (44). In the text, Ghazali ridicules the pretensions of the first group, noting that “a full explanation of the grounds on which a person may or may not be branded an Unbeliever would require long and detailed discussion,” and so offers both advice and a maxim for discernment in such matters: “as for the Advice, it is that you restrain your tongue, to the best of your ability, from indicting the people who face Mecca [on charges of Unbelief] as long as they say, ’There is no god but God, Muhammad is the messenger of God’, without categorically contradicting this… . As for the Maxim, it is that you know that speculative matters [al-nazariyat] are of two types. One is connected with the fundamental principles of creed, the other with secondary issues. The fundamental principles are acknowledging the existence of God, the prophethood of his Prophet, and the reality of the Last Day. Everything else is secondary” (112). So it should be clear that “those who rush to condemn people who go against the Ash’arite school or any other school as Unbelievers are reckless ignoramuses” (120).

The issue of “figurative interpretation” [ta’wil] of the Qur’an is more delicate, as controversies over “literal” and “figurative” interpretations in other Abrahamic traditions can testify. Ghazali distinguishes five “levels” of meaning, reminding us that all parties agree on these levels, and that the permissibility of engaging in figurative interpretation is contingent upon having established the logical impossibility of the apparent meaning [zahir] of a text; that is, “no one is permitted to move from one level to a level beneath it without being compelled by logical proof [burhan]” (104). These fences are designed to stem the antinomian tendencies of “some who style themselves Sufis to the effect that they have reached a state between themselves and God wherein they are no longer obligated to pray, and that drinking wine, devouring state funds, and other forms of disobedience are rendered licit to them.” Because such people “open doors to libertinism that can never be closed,” Ghazali does not hesitate to extend the full sanction of unbelief: “Such people, without doubt, must be executed, even if there remains some question as to whether they will abide in hellfire forever” (115). So the very demands of proper order in belief and practice may in the end be countermanded by God’s prevailing mercy, which also “will encompass … most of the Christians of Byzantium and the Turks of this age” (126). “Think, then, of God’s mercy as being as vast and as all-encompassing as it actually is. And do not measure divine issues with the adumbrative scales of formal reasoning” (129). So Ghazali’s last word on these matters effectively distances him from that “party of speculative theologians [al-mutikallimun] who Â… have narrowed the scope of God’s all-encompassing mercy” (120), and insists that “anyone who believes that the way to faith [iman] is speculative theology, abstract proofs, and systematic categorization is himself guilty of unsanctioned innovation [bida]. For faith in God comes rather of a light which God casts into the hearts of His servants, as a gift and gratuity from Him” (121).

Taken together with the astute introduction, this lucid translation reinforces the direction of current translation of and reflection on Ghazali, undertaken by Frank Griffel, Timothy Gianotti, Ebrahim Moosa, and others, which shows how philosophically sophisticated a guide he can be into such recondite matters. Indeed, the capacity for judgment and making relevant distinctions which he displays has been the hallmark of philosophical wit since Aristotle. And if he eschews giving current fashions of doing philosophy the last word when it comes to divine matters, that can only be traced to a profound respect for the subject in question; a respect which transfers to judicious advice and maxims for those who might be tempted to allow their perspectives to delimit membership in a saving community, in a vain attempt to atrophy divine mercy. His very witness shows how astute philosophical strategies can be employed to deny any ground to religious fanaticism, however powerless such strategies may be to curtail fanatics themselves. We are all in the debt of Sherman Jackson for providing us with so illuminating a translation and commentary. A comprehensive bibliography plus an index of technical terms complete the project.