On the Currency of Egalitarian Justice, and Other Essays in Political Philosophy

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G.A. Cohen, On the Currency of Egalitarian Justice, and Other Essays in Political Philosophy, Michael Otsuka (ed.), Princeton University Press, 2011, 268pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780691148717.

Reviewed by Peter Vallentyne, University of Missouri


When Jerry Cohen died from a stroke in August 2009, he had plans to publish his previously uncollected main articles. He had not, however, finalized those plans, and Michael Otsuka, his literary administrator, has done an excellent job of bringing those plans to fruition. The present book collects articles on egalitarianism, freedom and property, and (roughly) methodology in political philosophy and practice. Two more volumes will follow with essays on the history of moral and political philosophy, memoirs, and various philosophical reflections.

Part I of the volume consists of six previously published articles on egalitarianism (including his superb "Expensive Taste Rides Again") and an important previously unpublished afterword to "On the Currency of Egalitarian Justice" and "Equality of What?".  Part II consists of two previously published articles on freedom and property and two previously unpublished addenda to "Freedom and Money".  Part III consists of four essays on miscellaneous topics: his previously published review of Nagel's Equality and Partiality, his "Back to Socialist Basics", a new "How to Do Political Philosophy", and a short new piece based on expansions of excerpts from his Rescuing Justice and Equality.

In what follows, I shall comment only on the new material, but, since this material consists primarily of addenda to original work, it deals with relatively small issues. Readers will thus need to keep in mind that this collection includes major articles that deal at length with core issues relating to freedom and equality.

In the afterword to "On the Currency of Egalitarian Justice" and "Equality of What", Cohen further defends his claim that the relevant equalisandum of justice is sensitive to both brute luck resources and brute luck welfare. All else being equal, (1) those with fewer brute luck resources have a greater claim to more resources, and (2) those with less brute luck welfare have a greater claim to more resources. How exactly the two are to be traded-off is a difficult issue that troubled Cohen, but he insists that, at least in extreme cases, trade-offs are called for. In the afterword, he addresses objections raises by Rakowski, Rawls, Daniels, and Parfit. In the discussion of Parfit, he rightly argues that brute luck advantage could also serve as the basis for a prioritarian (rather than an egalitarian) theory.

I won't here assess the new arguments given. I'll simply note that I'm not convinced that inequalities in resource value are relevant. Equality of brute luck wellbeing seems to capture all that matters. In Cohen's famous take on Dworkin's Jude example, Jude has "cheap expensive tastes". This means that (1) it was initially cheaper than average to provide Jude with wellbeing (e.g., because he was born with cheap tastes), but (2) Jude is agent-responsible (via choice) for it now being more expensive than it initially was to provide him with wellbeing (e.g., because he cultivated expensive tastes). Equality of brute luck wellbeing requires giving Jude only the small amount of resources that initially (prior to his cultivation of more expensive tastes) was sufficient to give him the same wellbeing as others. Equality of brute luck resources requires giving him the same brute luck resources as others. Cohen's mixed view requires giving Jude more than the equal brute luck wellbeing share but less than the equal brute luck resource share. I'll simply record that I'm unmoved by this and related examples. I see no reason for Jude to have greater brute luck wellbeing than others simply because he started, as a matter of brute luck, with a cheaper disposition for wellbeing -- even if this means that he has radically fewer resources than others have. Obviously, this is an on-going debate.

In the first part of "Two Addenda to 'Freedom and Money'" (I'll not comment on the shorter second part), Cohen argues that negative freedom is sensitive to the means and abilities of the agent, and not (as usually assumed) merely to the lack of liability to interference from others. His main point is that interference from others restricts one's freedom only if the interference is effective in restricting what one can do. Whether interference is effective, however, depends on one's means and abilities. The blocking of my path by a bunch of tough guys does not restrict my freedom if I'm radically more powerful than they are or if I have a large private security team. Negative freedom can thus be reduced by lack of means or ability. Indeed, given that a given interference can always be overcome by sufficient means or ability, lack of means or ability is necessary for there to be a restriction of negative freedom. Interference is not sufficient. That seems correct and important. Cohen further argues that interference by others is not even necessary for loss of freedom generally (whether or not negative freedom). Mere losses of means or ability (e.g., loss of a car or of legs) reduce freedom, even if no one else has any disposition to interfere. As a descriptive point, it seems correct that there is more to freedom than negative freedom, but this leaves open, of course, whether justice is concerned only with negative freedom or with the fuller positive freedom.

In the new "How to Do Political Philosophy", Cohen gives four tips (addressed to graduate students) on how to do philosophy and political philosophy well. To do philosophy well, he emphasizes the importance of clear expression, of lack of fear of appearing stupid, and of not assuming that opposing views are obviously wrong. To do political philosophy well, he rightly emphasizes, one must distinguish carefully three distinct questions: (1) What is justice (which he understands as a kind of comparative fairness)? (2) What should the state do (which is sensitive to many considerations in addition to justice)? (3) What social states of affairs ought to be brought about (which is sensitive to considerations in addition to justice and which may be brought about by individuals as well as the state)? Cohen provides useful illustrations of each point, but it's not entirely clear that this was worth publishing.

In the partly new "Rescuing Justice from Constructivism and Equality from the Basic Structure Restriction" (excerpts from Rescuing Justice and Equality plus some new text), Cohen argues against the idea that the fundamental principles of distributive justice are whatever principles would be selected by a constructivist procedure (e.g., original position). He also argues against the idea that principles of distributive justice apply only to the basic structure of society (and not the actions of individuals).

Cohen argues against constructivism with respect to justice by claiming that (1) it fails to identify the fundamental principles of distributive justice, since its concern for feasibility and practicality is relevant for the selection of (instrumentally justified) practical rules of regulation but not for fundamental principles, and (2) it fails to distinguish the requirements of justice from other morally relevant considerations (such as efficiency) governing what ought to be done.

I'm not an expert on this topic, but let me express two worries. First, I don't see why a constructivist concept of justice must invoke issues of feasibility and practicality. If there are no mind-independent fundamental principles, the fundamental principles might be taken (on a certain metaethical view) to be those that all those in the original position (for example) would endorse after suitable reflection but with no concern for implementation. This seems to be constructivist and not to involve any issues of feasibility or practicality (except perhaps indirectly). Thus, although Cohen's criticism of Rawls's version of constructivism may be correct, it does not seem to be a general criticism of the view that the fundamental principles of distributive justice are whatever principles would be selected by a constructivist procedure of justice. Second, although I agree that it is preferable to reserve "justice" for a subset of moral requirements (e.g., comparative fairness, duties owed to each other, or enforceable duties), the term is unfortunately used in a wide variety of senses. In particular, some people (e.g., Rawls) understand justice more broadly to be something like moral permissibility of basic structures. In this broad sense, all moral values are relevant to the justice of basic structures. Of course, as Cohen rightly points out, if "justice" is understood in this broad sense, then it is detached from a long tradition of viewing justice as a particular kind of moral concern, and it makes it impossible for the moral principles that assess basic structures to be sensitive to justice (as an independent consideration).

In addition to his argument against constructivism, Cohen argues against the idea that justice is solely or primarily a matter of assessing the basic structure of a society. Although he allows that the principles of justice governing the actions of the members of society (the social ethos) need not be the same as those governing basic structures, Cohen argues against three reasons that have been given for why the difference principle does not apply to the latter. (1) He argues that the duties of an egalitarian ethos, like those of the basic structure, can be sufficiently precise to enable individuals to determine that others are complying (and thus be assured that each is doing her part in the collective duty). (2) He argues that the impact of a social ethos can, like the basic structure, be profound and present at the start. (3) He argues that, even if there is a moral division of labor -- with basic structures assessed primarily on the basis of impersonal reasons (e.g., justice) and individuals primarily left free to pursue their personal reasons -- this does not support the exclusion of all duties of justice for individual choices. As Rawls and Nagel recognize, individuals have certain natural impersonal duties: (a) the duty not to harm others, (b) the duty to do great good when one can do so at a small cost, and (c) the duty to comply with just basic structures when they exist and to help bring them about when they do not exist. Thus, the question is not whether individuals have impersonal duties, but what and how strong these duties are. Cohen agrees that individuals are not required to devote their lives to the impersonal demand to help the worst off, but he insists that this does not establish that there is no duty to do so when the costs are not too great.

Cohen wrote with incredible clarity, analyzed with great insight, and argued with the utmost rigor. He did all this while addressing fundamental problems of political philosophy. It will thus be a joy for those interested in these topics to read, or reread, these essays.