On the Genealogy of Color: A Case Study in Historicized Conceptual Analysis

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Zed Adams, On the Genealogy of Color: A Case Study in Historicized Conceptual Analysis, Routledge, 2016, 140pp., $116.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138928145.

Reviewed by Barry Maund, University of Western Australia


Zed Adams has written an intriguing book on an interesting topic. He employs an imaginative technique, which he calls "historicized conceptual analysis". He addresses a certain contemporary debate in the philosophy of color, on the question of color realism. More specifically, his target is a debate between Cartesian anti-realists and Oxford realists. The Cartesian anti-realists, e.g., John Mackie and myself, argue that objects do not have colors given our ordinary understanding of color. Oxford realists, e.g., Colin McGinn, John McDowell, and Gareth Evans, reject that thesis, arguing that our ordinary understanding of color fits a dispositionalist account of color.

As Adams points out, the first premise in the argument for Cartesian anti-Realism is a conceptual claim about how we ordinarily conceive of colors. It holds that color experience represents colors as being intrinsic properties of objects, properties that exist independently of their relations to light and perceivers. In this respect, Cartesian anti-realists hold that color experience represents colors as ontologically similar to other paradigmatically intrinsic properties of object such as shapes. In short, the first premise is the conceptual claim that we ordinarily conceive of both shape and colors as ontologically on a par: they are both conceived as intrinsic properties of objects that exist independently of their relations to light and perceivers.

Oxford realists propose that close attention to how we actually think about color shows that this first premise fundamentally mischaracterizes our ordinary conception. McDowell's underlying reason, for example, "for arguing that this premise is incoherent is that it asks us to think about colors in a way that he thinks is manifestly at odds with the only way we have for thinking about them, which is in dispositional terms" (p.6).

It is remarkable that two groups of philosophers can disagree on this matter, which seems to concern reflection on our perceptual experiences, and on how we would describe them. No doubt, each side will think that the opponent simply does not understand what is being claimed, or else is governed by some deep-seated theoretical prejudice. Whatever the case, one of us is right, and the other wrong. Adams, however, has a different view. He argues that each of these approaches make the same sort of error: they have a shared commitment to what he calls "the univocality assumption" -- the assumption that how we think about color must involve a single strand or thought running throughout, rather than "multiple, conflicting strands of thought" about color (p.131)

Adams contends that, in this area, as in many others, philosophers perform a conceptual analysis of our thinking about color which is ahistorical. By contrast, Adams wishes to defend a form of conceptual analysis that is historically based. Such an analysis presupposes that our current concepts about a topic (or at least about certain topics) are ones that have developed through a historical process. They do not comprise a single concept, but contain different strands that are the result of the historical process. Given this background, the sort of conceptual analysis called for is best thought of as a genealogy of the concept, rather than an ahistorical analysis.

The guiding thought for this application of genealogy is provided by Nietzsche, who specifically applied the notion to a study of the concepts of morality. Adams cites a quote from Maudmarie Clark on Nietzsche's use of the technique.[1]

Nietzsche's understanding of concepts explains why . . . our concepts need clarification. [It is] precisely because they are products of a complicated historical development. Different strands have been tied together into such a tight unity that they seem inseparable and are no longer visible as strands. To analyse or clarify such a concept is to disentangle these strands so that we can see what is actually involved in the concept. History can play a role in analysing a concept because at an earlier stages the 'meanings' that constitute it are not as tightly woven together and we can still perceive their shifts and rearrangements.

Adams proposes to follow a genealogical approach to our color concepts. In so doing, he challenges the univocality assumption by arguing that our current thinking about color reflects intuitions about color that derive from earlier views about color: those accepted by Aristotle and Descartes, respectively.

Some of the most interesting parts of the book, to my mind, are the historical chapters, in which Adams gives, first, an enlightening account of Aristotle's views on color and, then, of Descartes's response to that theory. He describes these theories as the Aristotelian and Cartesian strands, respectively, to acknowledge the role of other thinkers in the two traditions. Adams has a very interesting discussion of how, in the two strands, the respective theories of colors, light and vision, differ, and of the significance of these differences. He argues for the importance of seeing Descartes's views on color as part of a criticism of Aristotle's overall theories, especially with respect to explaining the colors of the rainbow.

A crucial element in Aristotle's theory is the distinction he draws between true and apparent colors. With experiences of true colors, light is necessary to see them, but the colors exist independently of light. With apparent colors, their very existence depends on light. In their theory of the rainbow, Aristotle and his followers "think that the colors of the rainbow are apparent colors, that is, they are mere appearances that are not really there" (p.34).

As Adams points out, Descartes rejects the Aristotelian distinction between true and apparent colors on the grounds that it rests upon the false presupposition that light plays a different role in producing our experiences of apparent colors than it plays in producing our experiences of true colors. According to the Aristotelian strand, only experiences of apparent colors are produced by light, and it is because of this that these experiences are mere appearances. Descartes's radical proposal is that the experiences of both true and apparent colors are brought about by the transduction of light by the retina. (p.57)

It is an important part of Adams's procedure to argue that both the Aristotelian and Cartesian strands continue to have influence over our current thought about color. One central way this influence is felt is in the place of certain intuitions which he has (and, plausibly, many of us would have) concerning judgements we would make about the color of objects in certain hypothetical situations. He describes a number of plausible examples -- "intuition pumps" -- that seem to reflect Aristotelian views about colors being properties independent of light and perceivers. Adams also describes two further intuition pumps that serve to indicate the persistence of the Cartesian way of thinking of colors. He writes that if you share his inclinations -- which are very natural to share -- then "that attests to the presence of the Cartesian strand in how we both think about the relationship between color experiences, light, and vision" (p.71). It is not, however, clear to me that the intuitions reflect the influence of Aristotle's thought, rather than simply reflecting the thought of someone "untutored by modern philosophy", in the words of Thomas Reid.

Perhaps the most philosophically crucial, and most controversial, chapter is the one entitled 'Descartes's Quandary'. Its significance lies in the fact that it illustrates a further crucial aspect of the genealogical approach, as described in the quote from Clark above. Adams proposes to show that the different strands are bound together in a unity, one that does not require logical consistency.

The quandary concerns the predicament that Descartes and his contemporaries are said to find themselves in, as the result of their criticisms of the Aristotelian strand. Adams argues that their criticisms, rather than leaving them well-positioned to take a straightforward position on the nature of color, leave them in a philosophical quandary about how to go on thinking about color. Understanding the nature of this quandary, he argues, allows us to see color-dispositionalism as a purported solution to the quandary. Hence we can see how the two strands are connected. Then follows a highly significant step: to show how ill-equipped dispositionalism is to fulfill its promise in this regard (p. 85). The solution is only a verbal solution.

I found this part of the book to be the most difficult. Adams does not sufficiently explain exactly what the quandary is. He says that Descartes's criticism of the Aristotelian distinction between true and apparent colors does not leave him with a positive philosophical position about the nature of color. Indeed it leaves him in a philosophical quandary about how exactly to go on thinking about color (p.90). As evidence for the presence of this quandary, Adams cites various passages in the writings of Descartes, Boyle and others, that show that these thinkers seem to vacillate over the question of the nature of colors. Sometimes they talk of them being dispositions in physical bodies to cause experiences, and sometimes as grounds of the dispositions, i.e., as 'textures', in the words of Boyle and Locke. I know that most commentators agree with Adams that this seeming vacillation should be embarrassing, and that there must be a "real" view that they hold. I must say that I am on the side of those who think the vacillation is, mostly, perfectly harmless.

There does not seem to me to be any great problem here. First of all, I take it for granted that Descartes and his contemporaries distinguish between two kinds of colors: color as a property of physical bodies and color-in-sensation, however these properties are thought of. Second, if we take it that Descartes and others are revising our thinking about color, putting a new way of talking and thinking in place both of the Aristotelian ways and the ordinary person's ways, then there is no reason why we should not introduce two or more new concepts of color, to apply to color-as-a property of physical bodies. It simply reflects the fact that we can be interested in different kinds of properties in different contexts and for different purposes. Newton expressed the point very well in the celebrated passage in which he compares colors with sounds[2]: "For as Sound in a bell, or musical String or other sounding body, is nothing but a trembling motion, and in the Air, nothing but that Motion propagated from the Object, and in the Sensorium 'tis a sense of that Motion under the form of sound so".

To be fair, Adams has more to say on this topic. For example, he says that the quandary is structured around two hard questions that cannot be answered consistently without leading to significant revisions in how we tend to think about what perception can and cannot do (p.93).

Hard Question (1): Can perception represent things to us without thereby making us aware of what those things are?
Hard Question (2): Do color experiences represent things outside of thought at all?

Adams argues that Descartes has serious problems handling both questions. However, his argument depends upon the internalism about the content of mental representations that he expresses in the Meditations.

Two comments are in order. First, even if Descartes is in a quandary, it is not at all clear that other thinkers in the same tradition should also find themselves in the same quandary. These thinkers do not share the epistemological assumptions that inform the Meditations, and which contribute heavily to the quandary as explained by Adams. So, even if Descartes has a quandary, it does not mean that the others do. Secondly, even with respect to Descartes himself, it seems that it is possible to treat the writer of the Meditations as different from, i.e., as engaged in different tasks from, the writer of his other works, e.g., The Principles of Philosophy, The Optics. There do not seem to be compelling reasons to treat the latter set of writings as requiring the Mediations, whatever Descartes himself may have thought. So it does not seem necessary to think that Descartes's views on color cannot be salvaged from any problems that might arise from his work in the Meditations.

All this may not matter for, in the next section, Adams explains, first, how dispositionalism emerges as an appealing position on the nature of color -- because it seems to provide a way out of Descartes's Quandary -- and, second, why this appeal is built on an illusion. The easiest way to see the problem with dispositionalism, he says, is to focus on an analogy that Descartes and many of his contemporaries rely on. Descartes, Locke and Boyle all illustrate their accounts of colorss as secondary qualities by analogy with a pin causing a pain. "The point of the analogy is that pain experience provides a useful model for thinking about the relationship between color experience and color" (p.99).

The model suggests that color experiences can make us aware of colors as the external causes of those experiences, without the experiences, in themselves, making us aware of whatever paradigmatically primary qualities are present in those external causes. In short, the analogy seems to provide us with a model "for thinking about how Descartes's problem can be solved in a way that does not require giving up either internalism or a deference to ordinary speech" (pp.99-100).

However, Adams thinks that this suggestion won't work, because it suffers from a disanalogy. "The disanalogy . . . is that although we do not think of pain experience as making us aware of properties of objects, we do think of color experiences as making us aware of properties of objects" (p.100). His reason for this is founded on the point made by Arnauld and Nicole that we never say that the fire is in pain. By contrast, we do say that objects are this or that color.

It seems to me that this criticism is open to two rejoinders. The first is that Descartes, Boyle and the others have chosen the wrong sort of example. Many of our pains are not caused by pins and other external objects but by our own body. We experience toothache, for example. In these cases, by contrast to the pin example, we do say that the pain is in the tooth or in the eye, or in the chest, slightly to the left. That is to say, we do attribute the painful quality to the part of the body that is the cause of the pain, the tooth, the eye, the elbow, etc. And we do say that the tooth is painful, my chest is painful, etc. The second rejoinder is more important. It reminds us that Descartes and the others are making recommendations for how to think and talk, philosophically, about colors. So they are recommending that we think about colors in the way that we do already about pains.

In the concluding chapter, Adams proposes to show "how we can move beyond the problem of color realism". Both the Cartesian anti-realists and the Oxford realists, he claims, present an account that collapses a crucial distinction, a result which undermines both of their positions. The distinction he has in mind is the distinction Robert Cummins makes between the target and the content of representations.

As far as Descartes's position is concerned, this assessment seems too quick. There is not enough space given to explaining exactly how Descartes collapses the target/content distinction. And it is not enough to say that Descartes commits himself to claims which collapse the distinction. What needs to be argued is that it is crucial to his account of color and secondary colors that he commit himself to the views that result in this collapse. It is instructive to reflect on what Adams says about Margaret Wilson's interpretation of Descartes.[3] He says, in a long footnote, that she argues that we can find such a distinction in Descartes's writings, as long as we are "prepared to be very flexible in interpreting his words" (p.134). Adams responds that nevertheless she admits that there are passages in which Descartes collapses the distinction. But his response is beside the point. The question is not whether Descartes does sometimes collapse the distinction; the question is whether he needs to in order to defend Cartesian anti-realism. The significance of what Wilson says is that it shows how Descartes can accommodate the distinction while preserving all he needs to preserve.

And finally, we must remember that Descartes is not the only anti-realist about colors. Even if Descartes sometimes collapses the distinction, it does not follow that other anti-realists need do so. This point is important since, as far as I can see, Adams places stress in his criticisms on the internalist position he presents in the Meditations -- which is not just internalist, but a special kind of internalism (think here of how Descartes's internalism differs from that of Frank Jackson and David Lewis and other color realists). Not all anti-realists, to say the obvious, subscribe to that position. It seems to me, moreover, that we do not need to interpret the other writings of Descartes as requiring that epistemology.

Adams has produced a stimulating and challenging book. It raises a host of interesting and thought-provoking questions. This feature alone makes the book worthwhile, even if there is much to disagree with.

[1] Maudmarie Clark, 1994, 'Nietzsche's Immoralism and the Concept of Morality', in R. Schact (ed.) Nietzsche, Genealogy, Morality, University of California Press, pp.15-34.

[2] Isaac Newton, 1952/1730, Opticks, Dover, p.124.

[3] Margaret D. Wilson, 1999, 'Descartes on the Representationality of Sensation', Ideas and Mechanism, Princeton University Press, pp.69-83