On the History of Religion and Philosophy in Germany and Other Writings

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Heinrich Heine, On the History of Religion and Philosophy in Germany and Other Writings, Terry Pinkard (ed.), Howard Pollack-Milgate (tr.), Cambridge University Press, 2007, 218pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521678506.

Reviewed by Jeffrey L. Sammons, Yale University


Heinrich Heine's Zur Geschichte der Religion und Philosophie in Deutschland, first published in French in 1834, then in German in censored form in the following year, is one half of a book that never appeared as one in German, but did in French as De l'Allemagne (1836), a title signaling Heine's intention to counter and displace Madame de Staël's influential work of 1810. The first part, Die Romantische Schule, appeared in 1833 first in French, then in German. Thus Heine replicates three of Staëls's four parts, though for both historical and ideological reasons he reverses her order of philosophy and religion. The purpose of Religion und Philosophie is to expose the secret of German philosophy, which Staël, under the influence of the reactionary, Catholicizing Romanticism of the Schlegels, had obscured and which the French have not understood. That secret is the overthrow of traditional religion and its replacement by a pantheism that acknowledges the material needs and desires of man. Christianity (by which Heine always means Catholicism) has oppressed mankind for centuries with an ascetic, life-denying spiritualism, which in the modern world serves the purposes of the despotic alliance of throne and altar. Now, however, the German contemplative mind of the revolution, joined with the French as its activist body, offers a prospect of sensualist emancipation, freedom from scarcity and the denial of the pleasures of the flesh, joy in the present not postponed to, as the old socialist song has it, pie in the sky when you die. This revolutionary message is the true meaning of Germany in the modern world, but it has not been understood because philosophers, notably Kant and Hegel, fearful of being understood by the people or the authorities, have hidden it in an incomprehensible style. Heine assigns himself the office of exposing it in a language that will be accessible to the common people and reveal its social significance.

To a complete translation of Religion und Philosophie this new book adds several other texts. The option of restoring the unity of De l'Allemagne by including the complete Romantische Schule has not been taken; only the first two of its three books are included, somewhat abridged. The other texts are part of a letter from Heine's student days, several poems, a philosophical parody from Die Stadt Lucca, the revolutionary appeal from the introduction to Kahldorf über den Adel, an anecdote about Hegel from the unpublished fragments that used to be called Briefe über Deutschland, and the accounts of Heine's return to religion and repudiation of Hegel in the Romanzero postscript and Geständnisse. All of these relate in one way or another to Heine's view of German philosophy in its relation to the age of revolution.

Religion und Philosophie and many of these other materials have been translated into English several times before, but Howard Pollack-Milgate's version is deserving of all praise. It is both faithful and fluent; to a large extent it reproduces for the reader the experience of reading Heine in German. There are places where I would have preferred different choices and one or another that might be accounted errors, but, given the overall excellence, it would be petty to pick at flaws. There is no indication of the censored passages that have been emended in the modern edition, but that is probably not necessary for this purpose. The rhyme schemes of the poems are not reproduced, so that they might be regarded as paraphrases rather than translations. The texts are lightly annotated with no ambition to exegesis.

The editor Terry Pinkard supplies a substantial and thoughtful introduction, acknowledging mainly English-language and especially British secondary sources, all of the highest quality. As a biographer of Hegel he is naturally interested in estimating Heine's relationship to the philosopher. He treats this matter in a circumspect way, acknowledging Heine's ambivalences but, on the whole, making a generous case for his knowledge of and, at the time of his cultural-historical essays, discipleship to Hegel. At the same time he recognizes that Heine may have obtained his understanding of Hegel not entirely from study but from his association with his fellow members of the Verein für Cultur und Wissenschaft der Juden in Berlin, notably Eduard Gans, an active Young Hegelian. Pinkard chides me for not clearly seeing this connection thirty years ago (xxiv, n. 22), but I have since come to his view of it. He rather surprisingly claims that "[t]he book has not been taken seriously as a post-Hegelian commentary" (xv). This may be owing to his dependence on his British sources, because it seemed for a long time that the Germans cared about little else.[1] It has appeared to me that the motive for this preoccupation has been to elevate Heine by making him an intermediate term between Hegel and Marx, an imputation traceable, I believe, to Georg Lukács. The purpose permeates the German scholarly discourse in several ways, among them an insistence on calling Heine's persistently unresolved dualisms "dialectical." Pinkard, however, writes that Heine "gave us a view that in one sense stands midway between Hegel and Nietzsche" (xxvii). A link from Heine to Nietzsche has been obnoxious to Marxists and their kin but has a way of recurring.[2] Heine is often thought to have anticipated the death of God at the end of Book Two of Religion und Philosophie: "Do you hear the bell ringing? Kneel down -- Sacraments are being brought to a dying God" (76), as well as in his dramatic retelling of Plutarch's account of the announcement of the death of Pan in Ludwig Börne. Eine Denkschrift. In Ecce homo, Nietzsche, as is well known, declared that Heine had given him the highest conception of the lyric poet and that the world would say that he and Heine are the best stylists in the German language. Several of the notes to the translated texts point to parallels with Nietzsche as well as with Hegel.

Pinkard concentrates on the similarities between Hegel's and Heine's views on the meaning and motions of history and the coming of the spirit to consciousness. The analysis is perceptive and well worth studying; it is to Pinkard's credit that he is skeptical about Adorno's claims of Heine's "homelessness" (xxv). He has relatively little to say about the spiritualist-sensualist dichotomy because he does not want to distract attention from Hegel by putting too much stress on the influence from Saint-Simonianism. It is true that, although Heine has at least as much to say about it as he does about Hegel, its importance to him has sometimes been exaggerated, as his sensualism was taking form before he was interested in the Saint-Simonian movement. Nevertheless, the antithesis of spiritualism and sensualism, or Nazarenism and Hellenism, is central to his politics and anthropology. The resolution of this ancient opposition he believed to be the higher historical imperative of his time, the commitment to which certified for him his revolutionary superiority over the beleaguered liberals and radicals with their parochial political concerns.

It would be absurd of me to contend with Pinkard about Hegel. Still, there is room for doubt about the depth and precision of Heine's reception. For one thing, one would like to have some evidence beyond speculative construction. Heine's allusions to Hegel are all quite brief and many of them dismissive. I wonder if anyone reading the texts provided here, especially the addenda, without the guiding introduction would conclude that Heine had a significant understanding of and commitment to Hegel. In Heine's preserved personal library there is a copy of Hegel's Vorlesungen über die Philosophie der Geschichte, dated, incidentally, 1840. This suggests that there were two phases of Heine's Hegel reception, one in the 1820s during his student days in Berlin and one in the 1840s around the time of his association with Marx. It may be that the philosophy of history was the most important or perhaps the only work of Hegel that concerned Heine; it is the only lecture course that we know he attended in Berlin. For him as perhaps for other Young Hegelians it was not the complex details of Hegel's philosophy that were important, but the implication that history contained an indwelling dynamic that would enable it to move again, that the torpor and stasis imposed as a policy by the Metternichian regime would not be permanent. This revolutionary hopefulness, generally characteristic of Heine until the disappointments of 1848, enabled the younger generation to overlook Hegel's apparent position as a state philosopher stabilizing the Prussian monarchy.

Beyond such considerations, caution is recommendable. Disconcerting, not only here, is an inclination to ascribe an influence to Hegel's aesthetics (e.g., 40, n. 60). The lectures were not given during Heine's time in Berlin and were published posthumously in 1835, after Heine had composed his cultural-historical essays. Is it plausible that he could have absorbed the details of Hegel's aesthetics from conversation with his friends? Pinkard begins a sentence: "Playing no doubt on Hegel's own account in the Phenomenology …" (xxi). There is no reason to think that Heine read the Phenomenology or could have understood it if he had. There has always been an unconfessed uneasiness about Heine's command of and competence in philosophical matters. A claim was once advanced, steadfastly ignored by the Heine folk, that he had obtained the basics of his philosophical knowledge from his secondary-school textbooks.[3]

The book is in very good condition; misprints, such as a misspelling of my name in one place (xxxviii), are few. There is one glitch that must be the result of an accident, where Pinkard refers to Heine's characterization of "the Bible, the book the Jews had preserved … as their 'portable fatherland' ('aufgeschriebene Vaterland')" (xix). Here a passage in the voice of the satirized Jewish believer Simson in the fragmentary novel Schnabelewopski is conflated with one in Heine's own voice from the Geständnisse (portatives Vaterland), which, in fact, appears in the addenda of this volume (213). The note refers to the former but quotes the latter. In another minor slip, Madame du Deffand gets renamed "Devant" (53). That Pinkard is not deeply engaged with Heine as a whole -- there is no bibliography, so that it is not easy to see all that has been consulted -- is indicated by several errors in the skeleton summary of his life: the account of the failure of young Heine's retail business is imprecise (xxxiii); the tragedy Almansor is misspelled several times; the French version of Die Romantische Schule is put into the wrong year (xxxv); and a remark on "Salomon Heine's sons" (xxxvi) is incorrect, as he had only one surviving son at that time. The index is selective. One inconsistency that could have been easily repaired is that, while the translations are properly based on the Düsseldorf Historisch-kritische Gesamtausgabe der Werke and the East German Säkularausgabe, Pinkard in his introduction employs the four-volume Artemis & Winkler edition edited by Jost Perfahl et al. in its printing of 2001, making it inconvenient for those who do not have it at hand to pursue his citations.

This publication is a substantial achievement that may animate discussion of Heine's cultural, philosophical, and religious critique in English-speaking countries.

[1] See among many items Eduard Krüger, Heine und Hegel. Dichtung, Philosophie und Politik bei Heinrich Heine, Kronberg: Scriptor, 1977; Jean Pierre Lefebvre, Der gute Trommler. Heines Beziehung zu Hegel, Hamburg: Hoffmann und Campe, Heinrich Heine Verlag, 1986; Winfried Sembdner, Heine und die Hegelschule. Die Entstehung und Veränderung von Heines Hegelbild im Kontext zeitgenössischer Philosophie und Philosophiekritik, Frankfurt am Main: Peter Lang, 1994.

[2] See especially Hanna Spencer, "Heine und Nietzsche," Spencer, Dichter, Denker, Journalist. Studien zum Werk Heinrich Heines, Bern: Peter Lang, 1977, 65-100.

[3] Ruth Saueracker-Ritter, Heinrich Heines Verhältnis zur Philosophie, Munich: Dissertationsdruck-Schön, 1974.