On the Soul and Other Psychological Works

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Aristotle, On the Soul and Other Psychological Works, Fred D. Miller, Jr. (tr.), Oxford University Press, 2018, lxxiv + 276pp., $14.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199588213.

Reviewed by Jason W. Carter, Exeter College, University of Oxford


Fred D. Miller, Jr.'s stated goal for his new translation for the Oxford World's Classics series is, 'to provide a clear and accessible translation of Aristotle's psychological works while . . . conveying something of his distinctive style'. Not only does Miller achieve these goals in spades, but he also provides something more. His translation of Aristotle's De Anima and Parva Naturalia (the 'short works concerning nature'), along with twenty-three selected fragments from Aristotle's lost works and his 'Hymn to Hermias', is elegant, philosophically sensitive, and informed by some of the best recent scholarly work on Aristotle's psychology and biology (including his own: see Miller 1999; 2000; 2012).

Miller's new translation contains everything a reader without Greek needs in order to begin exploring the relevance of Aristotle's thought to modern philosophical psychology and philosophy of mind, as well as much that will be of interest to historians of psychology and biology. Alongside a Preface, References, Introduction, Note on the Translation, Select Bibliography, Outline of Aristotle's Psychological Works, Chronology of Aristotle, Textual Notes, Glossary of Key Terms, and Index, it also contains a detailed set of Explanatory Notes. Within the latter, Miller pays special attention to the interpretations of the Greek commentators (including Michael of Ephesus and Sophonias for the Parva Naturalia), whilst also taking care to explicate Aristotle's thoughts by drawing upon other closely related Aristotelian texts. Aside from a few exceptions that I discuss below, these notes are superb.

Miller's translation is eminently readable. This is due in large part to his willingness to break up Aristotle's Greek sentences, which vary in length and complexity, into shorter and more measured English ones. This allows his translation both to 'convey something' of Aristotle's distinctive style, and, in many places, to improve it. (In this respect, it approximates closely in rhythm and control to W.S. Hett's translation in his Loeb edition of the De Anima and Parva Naturalia.) A further feature to be praised is Miller's not infrequent choice to read the Greek pronoun tis ('someone') in place of ti ('something') when possible, which adds a personal touch to Aristotle's prose and often makes it feel livelier.

Another welcome feature is that Miller makes Aristotle's discussions about the soul appear more scientific, in the modern sense. For instance, in rendering into English Aristotle's often bland references to his predecessors, e.g. 'these differ over what the principles are' (405b30-31), and 'Some of the cruder ones such as Hippo, have even claimed that it is water' (405b1-2), Miller offers the richer, 'These theorists differ over what the principles are' and 'Some of the cruder theorists, such as Hippo, have even claimed that it is water' (p. 6-7). Other translational choices lend support to this scientific feel, e.g. Miller's rendering of apodidonai (which can also mean, more neutrally, 'to give/render an account') as 'to explain'.

These translational emphases have the cumulative effect of bringing into focus something that would have been obvious to Aristotle's ancient readers, but is sometimes lost in modern translations -- that On the Soul, and the Parva Naturalia, however one wishes to classify them vis-à-vis Aristotle's idealized Posterior Analytics conception of the demonstrative sciences, were on the cutting edge of ancient psychological research.

In respect of Aristotle's metaphysical terminology, Miller keeps entelecheia and energeia related but distinct, rendering the former as 'actualized', and (in the dative) 'in an actualized way', and energeia as 'actuality' and (in the dative) 'in actuality'. For On the Soul, he also, and helpfully, chooses to keep Aristotle's terminology for closely related intellectual processes distinct. The noun nous (rendered as 'reason' in Shields' and 'understanding' in Reeve's) becomes 'thought', and noein 'thinking', whilst dianoia becomes 'cognition'.

If one were to find something to complain about, it is that this policy is somewhat relaxed in the translation of the Parva Naturalia. In On Perception and Perceptible Objects, and in Memory and Recollection, for instance, 'thinking' is also used to translate ennoein and oiesthai. These translations, while perfectly acceptable from a linguistic standpoint, might mislead a reader into supposing that Aristotle's repeated worries about thought's separability from the body or its relation to imagistic processes is resolved (or collapsed) in these shorter works. However, this is quibbling more than anything.

To get a flavour of the clarity and readability of Miller's translation of On the Soul in relation to another commonly used one, I offer On the Soul 1.5, 411a16-23. First, the Revised Oxford Translation (ROT):

The opinion that the elements have soul in them seems to have arisen from the doctrine that a whole must be homogeneous with its parts. If it is true that animals become animate by drawing into themselves a portion of what surrounds them, the partisans of this view are bound to say that the soul too is homogeneous with its parts. If the air sucked in is homogeneous, but soul heterogeneous, clearly while some part of soul will exist in the inbreathed air, some other part will not. The soul must either be homogeneous, or such that there are some parts of the whole in which it is not to be found.

Now Miller's translation:

They seem to suppose that the soul is in these elements because the whole is of the same kind as its parts. Hence, they must say that the soul, too, is of the same kind as its parts, if animals become animate because they receive something from the surrounding atmosphere. If the air that is scattered is all of the same kind, but the soul has dissimilar parts, it is clear that one part of the soul will be present but another part will not. Necessarily, therefore, either the soul has similar parts or it is not present in every part whatsoever of the whole.

Although one potentially loses an opportunity in Miller's translation to see some of Aristotle's more interesting technical terms at play here (e.g homoiomerēs, anhomoiomerēs), it, unlike the ROT, makes the logic of the argument crystal clear. It is also more graceful, and more accurate, than the ROT. There is nothing, for instance, corresponding in Greek to the ROT's 'doctrine', 'sucked in' or 'inbreathed'. The ROT also conflates the distinct terms homoeidēs and homoimerēs in a context in which there is a question about whether individual souls have 'parts' (merē).

Miller's explanatory notes, whilst economical, also stand out as providing a fresh perspective on Aristotle's role in the history of biology. Although Miller duly notes Aristotle's biological mistakes, e.g. his claim that the heart has only three chambers, and that tiny organisms can be generated spontaneously out of inanimate matter, he resists attributing these mistakes to naïveté or scientific laziness. Instead, he reminds us of the concrete difficulties of doing biological research in the ancient world; the former mistake, he suggests, may have been due to 'the difficulty of observing the left atrium' (p. 231); and the latter one, he reminds us, was not refuted until 1849, when 'Louis Pasteur 'demonstrated that growth did not occur in an experimental container from which micro-organisms were excluded' (p. 186).

Miller's biological interests are also on display in his explanatory notes, which are chock-full of helpful overviews of claims Aristotle makes in the History of Animals, Parts of Animals, and Generation of Animals -- the first of which is often neglected (due in part to its density) in studies of Aristotle's psychology. For instance, in commenting upon On the Soul 2.10, 422b21, which concerns whether flesh (sarx) is the organ of the soul's capacity for touch, Miller informs the reader that sarx, for Aristotle, is not skin (derma) -- it is rather the soft material between skin and bone -- and gives us Aristotle's theory of how skin is formed through the drying of flesh from the Generation of Animals, and relates that Aristotle rejects skin as the bodily organ of touch in the History of Animals. Notes like these allow the reader to see just how close the connection often is between Aristotle's psychological and biological research.

Readers will also find it fascinating to read 'fragments' from a younger Aristotle -- many of which (such as those reported by Cicero about the Eudemus) suggest his belief in the immortality of the soul -- in juxtaposition with the Parva Naturalia. It is striking to read, for instance, Sextus Empiricus' testimony that in On Philosophy Aristotle held that in sleep the soul 'takes on its own proper nature and prophesises and tells the future' (p. 164), and Cicero's report that in the Eudemus Aristotle interpreted Eudemus' dream vision that he would 'return home' as a true prophecy about the separation of his soul from his body when he died in battle at Syracuse. This is because, in On Prophecy Through Sleep, just a few books back, the older Aristotle is wryly sceptical of such divine visions.

There are a few places where Miller's manuscript readings might be questioned. For his base texts, he relies upon Ross's 1956 Oxford Classical Text edition (OCT) of the De Anima, and Ross's 1955 critical editions of the Parva Naturalia and Fragmenta for the other psychological works. His readings are, with few exceptions, conservative. By my count, of the 66 places where his translation departs from the OCT, 58 are simply rejections of Ross's readings in favour of the majority of the MSS. Most of these changes are welcome (Ross's editions of the De Anima are widely acknowledged to have problems) and render many of Aristotle's claims more perspicuous. However, at least two of these departures are worth commenting on.

The first place is On the Soul 1.1, 403a25, wherein Miller rejects the reading logoi enuloi 'enmattered accounts' found in MSS U and X, in favour of logoi en huloi or 'accounts in matter', found in E, C, and Ha. Although this reading is acceptable on a number of grounds -- one of which is that enuloi is a hapax legomenon within Aristotle's corpus -- it also, I think, suggests that Miller has an interest in recent debates on whether Aristotle thinks that the definitions of natural things must include a reference to matter or the states of bodies. In his notes on the passage, he mentions no particular exponents of this view, but is clear that only the former (rejected) reading is compatible with the view that definitions contain a reference to matter.

The second departure worth noting is in On the Soul 1.4, 408b5-13, wherein Aristotle infamously claims at 408b11 that, 'to say that the soul grows angry is like if someone were to say that the soul weaves and builds'. Miller claims that the passage's interpretation 'is complicated by the fact that the long sentence 408b5-18 in the manuscripts is incomplete. It begins with a conditional clause, but lacks a main clause' (p. 178). However, this claim is misleading, since reading , which has some manuscript support in S codex Laurentianus 81, T codex Vaticanus 256, and U codex Vaticanus 260, unproblematically makes 408b11-13 the beginning of the main clause of the passage. It was for this reason adopted by H. Bonitz and R.D. Hicks. (Hamlyn 2002, p. 6, also translates the passage as a complete conditional.) Since Miller is elsewhere quite scrupulous in highlighting alternative readings of far less controversial passages, this may simply be an oversight. For further discussion of how the passage might work with the complete conditional claim, see Carter 2018.

There is also at least one topic on which the introduction, translation, and notes might be improved. In the introduction, whilst commenting on Aristotle's discussion at On the Soul 1.1, 404b18-27 of the view put forward in 'the things said in On Philosophy', namely, that the soul's epistemic states (thought, knowledge, belief, and perception) are, like the Forms themselves, 'identical to numbers', Miller claims that Aristotle is either interpreting Plato 'very freely', or drawing upon his personal knowledge of Plato's 'unwritten doctrines' (p. xxiv, n. 11). His explanatory notes support the latter option, as they mention Philoponus' and Ps.-Simplicius' suggestion that the work Aristotle references is not his own lost dialogue On Philosophy, but his notes on Plato's lectures on the Good.

The problem is that there is textual and doxographical evidence, which Miller overlooks, that Aristotle is referring to own lost dialogue, On Philosophy, and that the view in question may not be Plato's. First, the clause beginning at 404b21 is missing a verb. Miller reads an implied 'he says' (legei) here, but since the immediately preceding verb is the passive diōristhē ('it was determined that'), which refers to claims made in On Philosophy, we should probably understand the same verb here (as Hicks and Reeve do). If so, Aristotle may be referring to a character in this dialogue (who may or may not be Plato). Second, Miller neglects to mention the view of Themistius, who informs us that the theory that Forms are identical to numbers and that Form-numbers are identical to psychic states is from Xenocrates' work On Nature, of which Themistius claims first-hand knowledge. (On Aristotle on the Soul, 11.37 -12.1; 12.28-30; 31.33-5; 32.19-33). Scholars have disputed this evidence, but it is worthy of mention.

Miller's translation ends with a poem ascribed to Aristotle, his 'Hymn to Hermias', which he describes as a 'fitting coda' to Aristotle's psychological works' (p. 168). Although its language is lofty enough to accommodate almost any particular view of the soul one wishes to ascribe to Aristotle, its placement at the end of Miller's translation suggests that, in the end, Aristotle is best interpreted as having remained within the tradition of Greek thought in which immortality consists in being remembered and celebrated by mortals for one's virtue. Whilst I myself would resist this line of interpretation, the hymn is nevertheless a fitting reminder that Aristotle was not just a passionless instantiation of nous, but a human being who grieved over the death of his friends.

I probably cannot overemphasise how good this translation is a whole, and how useful it will be to students and scholars wanting an accessible, up to date translation of all of Aristotle's psychological works together. Miller's work is a great scholarly achievement, and one that is worth far more than its listed price.


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Carter, J. (2018). 'Does the Soul Weave? Reconsidering De Anima 1.4, 408a29-b18'. Phronesis 63:25-63.

Hamlyn, D. (2002). Aristotle De Anima: Books II and II (With Passages from Book I). Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Hett, W.S. (1986). Aristotle: On the Soul, Parva Naturalia, On Breath (Loeb Classical Library). Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.

Hicks, R. (1907). Aristotle De Anima. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Miller, Jr., Fred D. (1999). 'Aristotle's Philosophy of Soul'. The Review of Metaphysics 53: 309-337.

Miller, Jr., Fred D. (2000). 'Aristotle's Philosophy of Perception'. Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy 15:177-230.

Miller, Jr., Fred D. (2012). 'Aristotle on the Separability of Mind', in Christopher Shields (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Aristotle (Oxford: Oxford University Press): 306-339.

Reeve, C.D.C. (2017). Aristotle, De Anma. Translated with Introduction and Notes. Indianapolis/Cambridge: Hackett.

Shields, Christopher (2016). Aristotle, De Anima. Translation, Introduction, and Commentary. Oxford: Clarendon Aristotle Series.

Themistius. (1996). On Aristotle on the Soul, trans. R. Todd. London: Duckworth.