Once Out of Nature: Augustine on Time and the Body

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Andrea Nightingale, Once Out of Nature: Augustine on Time and the Body, University of Chicago Press, 2011, 244pp., $39.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226585758.

Reviewed by James Wetzel, Villanova University


The title of Andrea Nightingale's evocative study of Augustine on time and the body is lifted from a line of Yeats (1928): "Once out of nature I shall never take/ My bodily form from any natural thing." Such is the resolution of an old man, consumed by time and weary of a place "that is no country for old men"; he is on his way to a city of sages, where he hopes to unfasten his heart from "a dying animal" and be gathered into "the artifice of eternity" -- perhaps as some Grecian-crafted golden bird, singing unfading songs "of what is past, or passing, or to come."

Not unlike the aging Yeats, Nightingale's Augustine fancies himself in the process of a transfiguring relocation: from an earthly city defined by its unguarded love of temporary, consumable selves to an eternal sanctuary, where time exists, if at all, only as an unthreatening memory. Nightingale will liberally use the term "transhuman" to track Augustine's ideal of the undying life; it is a term of contemporary provenance -- as in R.C.W. Ettinger's cryonics manifesto (1974/ 2005) -- and it connotes the technological aspiration to conquer aging and eventually death itself. But she is keenly aware that for Augustine there is nothing artificial about the undying life; in craving it, we crave only what is most natural to us. It is the dying life, shot through with corrupt volition (original sin), that is the unnatural artifice.

Nightingale is fascinated, and rightly so, with the impress of Augustine's dubiously natural transhumanism upon his conception of embodiment. In her first chapter, on Edenic and resurrected transhumans, she clarifies the basic structure of Augustine's transhuman idealizations. Take the Edenic context first, the time before historical time. Before they fall in with the serpent, partake of forbidden fruit, and forfeit access to the tree of life, Adam and Eve eat without hunger, drink without thirst, love without lust, and grow old without aging. There is a palpable fixity to their lives, as if they were two hermetically sealed bundles of perfectly individuated flesh. It is hard to imagine them wanting to have sex, wondering about the future, or feeling an urge to sin.

Nightingale does not enter with Augustine into the puzzle of their original transgression; she merely reports on his sense of sin's effect (p. 7): "In Augustine's view, when Adam and Eve 'fell' into earthly bodies, they also 'fell' into time." Although she says that she is cuing her reading of Augustine on Genesis to his later commentaries -- the great literal commentary (401-14) and relevant books of City of God (413-27) -- her inclination to speak of a fall into time and the body fits better with Augustine's early allegorical reading of Genesis, written against the Manichees and their dualism of good and bad matter (388-89); there he entertains the idea that Adam and Eve were originally immaterial beings who were subsequently made to suffer materialization.

Be that as it may, Nightingale finds the more telling of Augustine's transhuman idealizations in his reading of endings, not beginnings. At the end of historical time, God will reunite the souls of disincarnated saints with the bodies that they once experienced, while "resident aliens" on earth (Nightingale's term), as imperfectly their own. The relevant bodies get reconstituted out of material dispersion (out of the slippage of the human into the humus), but once reconstituted they are, in a way that eludes both Edenic and historical bodies, originally and ideally material; they are the bodies that human beings were meant to have but somehow never experienced. The saints in heaven, in their out-of-time life, are the only human beings who will ever know what it means to be perfectly embodied.

In Nightingale's analysis of this strange Augustinian twist, the transhuman condition of resurrected bliss perfects not only historical embodiment but also Edenic life before the first sin. Life for humans in historical time remains very much an affair of material co-mingling and dissolution, a consuming and a being consumed: eating works that way; sex seems to aspire to a similar effect. And while it is certainly true that in unspoilt Eden there is less evidence of a human preoccupation with consuming desire, there are still some hints at this desire's latency. Eve and Adam do not experience hunger and thirst, but they do eat and drink; they do not experience lust, but they must sexually conjoin before they can procreate. Eden is a world that is, humanly speaking, pitched between consumption and contemplation. It should not be surprising, then, that it can seem an off-putting paradise. The consumers will want more animality in their lives; the contemplatives will want liberation from earthly necessities. The heaven that Augustine envisions is a contemplative's paradise. There resurrected bodies are translucent and self-revealing, and they occasion no carnal desire in the souls that conjoin with them; all of the old bodily organs, the unruly genitalia included, will have become by then "useless" objects of beauty (p. 47) -- museum pieces, really. For as Nightingale wryly notes (p. 48): "The resurrected body will look a bit like the Pompidou Center, with the inner organs on view."

If it is true, as Nightingale suggests, that Augustine's definitive notion of selfhood turns out to be a transhuman ideal, then his transhumanism must surely be informing (and arguably distorting) his attempt to fathom the merely human side of things. In her second chapter, on temporal identity ("Scattered in Time"), Nightingale insists that there are two temporalities that govern Augustine's conception of this-worldly embodiment, that they are distinctly different, and that apart from some consideration of their heterochronic interaction, there can no real understanding of Augustine either on time or on the body. One temporality she calls "psychic time," and this is the temporality that most all of Augustine's interpreters have managed to notice, even if they choose to give it varying significance. In book 11 of the Confessions Augustine famously identifies time with the extension of his present awareness into memory and expectation (distentio animi; see esp. Confessions 11.26.34, 11.27.36). Nightingale sidesteps the usual interpretative wrangle here -- the question of whether Augustine is proposing a "subjective" theory of time -- and focuses instead on the shift in psychic time away from present awareness (p. 56): "I use psychic time to refer to Augustine's claim that the mind distends away from the present into the past and the future." The other temporality she calls "earthly time," and it surprises her that so few of Augustine's interpreters have taken note of it (she may in fact be on her own here). "I use earthly time," she writes (p. 56), "to refer to the aging and changing of bodies in the natural world as the seasons pass."

Psychic and earthly time do not play well together. Earthly time is indexed to the body and is focused on present awareness; psychic time prescinds from the present and seeks vainly to avoid a bodily focus on time. It takes the perspective of both earthly and psychic time to disclose the mutable, mortal nature of the time-marking body, but given the antipathy between the times, their conjunction speaks mainly to the impossibility of transhumanism on earth. In her third chapter, on selfhood ("The Unsituated Self"), Nightingale casts Augustine's search for the self -- a soul/body harmonization -- into the context of temporal incongruity ("heterochronic time zones") and draws the obvious moral (p. 105): "The Augustinian self is a moving target, full of absences and lacunae." It is less obvious how full and stable selfhood may be thought to result from otherworldly transhumanism (where one kind of lacuna replaces another), but Nightingale has scarcely been styling herself as a defender of Augustine's transhumanism and its unappealing "metaphysics of presence." She lets that one go.

So it is not the ghostly metaphysics of a theologically motivated transhumanism that Nightingale commends most to her readers' attention. Once we travel in thought to where Augustine's resurrected saints reside, Nightingale expects us to recognize fairly quickly that something has gone terribly wrong with Augustine's idealization. The celestial museum, where everything is on display but nothing is taken in, is no fit place for metamorphotic human beings to reside. Readers who have somehow managed to miss this point in Nightingale's analysis of Augustine have the benefit of her book's epilogue, on "mortal interindebtedness." There she summons three modern authors -- Herman Melville, Henry David Thoreau, and the Czech playwright Karel Čapek -- to inveigh against transhumanism and encourage us to pay our "earthly dues" (p. 198).

This part of her book is the most evocative and the least analytic. It closes on a lovely contrast of images from Čapek, who favors the experience of the garden worm, "tasting all the dark, nitrogenous, and spicy delights of the soil," over that of the butterfly, "intoxicated by the perfumes of flowers" (p. 209), but the images say little about what it would mean to pay our earthly dues. No doubt it means, in part, not giving in to transhumanism, in to the temptation, rooted in fear of death, to resist natural change and transformation. But when I affirm the value of being a self that goes through, in some fashion, a series of deaths and rebirths, who is it that is doing the affirming? My sympathetic identification with a garden worm will not help me here.

The principal analytic offering of Nightingale's book is her distinction between the two temporalities, psychic and earthly, and it is a distinction that is absolutely central to her appropriation of Augustine. Apart from it, Augustine on time and body is just some benighted transhumanist, confusing his resentment of death with faith in God; with it, Augustine is a guide to heterochronic living. He is hardly the best of guides, to be sure, since he tends to want to resolve heterochronic life into transhumanism, but give him credit for seeing into the incongruity that renders time into a vehicle of transformation. He could hardly have done this if no part of him were resonant with the sensibilities of a Melville, a Thoreau, or a Čapek. It is the Augustine of the dual temporalities, then, that escapes his Patristic cul-de-sac and enters into literary postmodernism, where love of both text and body (the two personae of 'corpus') is the endgame. (Nightingale is a professor of comparative literature as well as classics, and she is clearly well versed in contemporary theory.)

My most serious misgivings about her study of Augustine -- which on the whole I find marvelously thought-provoking -- concern her development of the two temporalities distinction. First of all, I think that there is a good reason why earthly time has gone unnoticed in Augustinian studies. It is not a form of time. In Confessions 11 Augustine is quite intent on not confusing time with what can serve as a measure of time. Regular physical movement is a common measure of time, but since any kind of physical movement, regular or not, takes place within time, physical movement is not what time is. Granted, the regularity of the seasons or of the aging body differs markedly from the regularity of a sweep second hand or of a planetary orbit; still, material metamorphosis is no more a mode of time itself than is locomotion.

Contrast the case of psychic time. When Augustine tries to find time outside the distention of his soul, he notices time's slippage into nonbeing: into the 'no longer' and the 'not yet.' The being of time itself seems to depend, then, on the capacity of his soul (or some soul) to translate past, present, and future time into three modes of distended presence (Confessions 11.20.26): the present of things past, the present of things future, and the present of things present. But as the soul enfolds time into a threefold presence, so does time disarticulate the soul, resolving memory and expectation back into the 'no longer' and the 'not yet.' Augustine has tried and failed to render his soul into a measure of time; this leaves him with psychic time. Nightingale, recall, defines psychic time as the soul's distention away from the present and into the past and future. That is not Augustine's conception. Psychic time is the distention of presence into past, present, and future. The real question for him is this: whose presence? His own experience of psychic time has been that of a rending and a scattering: mortal wear and tear, exacerbated by fantasies of being above it all. Augustine begins to realize that he is not and has never been the unity of his own life.

Nightingale is not wrong to suspect that Augustine is given to transhuman fantasies (some he admits to, some he fails to notice), but her way of parsing time for him leaves him with little choice but to commit to some such fantasy. When psychic time gets stripped of its essential pathos, its liability to being emptied out, and the body is then made out to be the bearer of suffering, the only freedom from death comes from a freedom from time itself. Perhaps that is the right conclusion, and, if so, we can debate the merits of death. But we will have yet to confront what is at the heart of Augustine's vision of time and the body: the God who suffers death in order to defeat it. Nightingale explains in a stunningly brief note why she chooses not to discuss the incarnation (p. 14, n. 30): "my focus is on human embodiment." For Augustine, God's incarnation in Jesus of Nazareth is a human embodiment, more human perhaps than what passes for such with the rest of us. In any case, it is not the transhuman Christ, enthroned in resurrected glory, that frees us from the crooked love of many a false idealization, but our flesh-and-blood connection -- finally inconceivable -- to a dying divinity.


Ettinger, Robert (1974/ 2005), Man into Superman, ed. Charles Tandy, Palo Alto, CA: Avon.

Yeats, William Butler (1928/ 1989), "Sailing to Byzantium," in The Collected Poems of W.B. Yeats, ed. Richard Finneran, New York: Simon & Schuster, p. 193.