One God of All? Probing Pluralist Identities

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Garth Hallett, One God of All? Probing Pluralist Identities, Continuum, 2010, 141pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826446329.

Reviewed by Carl Mosser, Eastern University


Religious pluralism is an important, frequently discussed theological and cultural phenomenon of our time. Most books on pluralism are designed to argue in favor of or against its basic truth claims. Garth Hallett has instead produced a clearly written and tightly argued analysis of identity claims that lie at the heart of the pluralist thesis. Hallett's goal is not to advocate or oppose pluralism as such, but to scrutinize pluralist identity claims in order to assay their significance and meaning.

Hallett helpfully distinguishes and categorizes various kinds of pluralist identity claims. He considers as most significant those which assert that Yahweh, Allah, Vishnu, Tao, nirvana, etc. refer to the same ultimate reality, being, or thing. Subjecting claims of this type to modest Wittgensteinian linguistic analysis leads to the conclusion that they are neither true nor false. They are, instead, vacuous since there are no obvious criteria for individuating transcendent "realities," "beings," or even mere "things." Hallett does not, however, leave the matter there. Instead, he suggests that the pluralist thesis might be saved by replacing identity claims with apt comparisons designed to determine the extent to which the beliefs and religious experiences produced by different religions converge. Hallett sounds a note of skepticism about whether this approach will prove more successful and reminds readers of how easily we are led astray by the workings of our own languages. This thin volume would serve as an excellent text for discussion in upper-level and graduate seminars on religious pluralism or philosophy of religion.

In the first half of the book (chapters 1-5), Hallett sets out to collate pluralist identity claims, compare them, weigh their significance, and assess arguments for and against their veracity. He begins by distinguishing three types of identity claims. Claims of the first type do not assert any kind of cognitive relationship between the world's religions and a single transcendent reality. Cognitive relationships are defined broadly: knowing, believing, experiencing, being aware of, naming, referring to, speaking about, and adoring. Cognitive relationships are not necessarily excluded, but identity claims of this type focus on causal or other non-cognitive relationships. For example, a single transcendent reality may be said to be "at work in," "influencing," or "present to" the world religions. Likewise, the religions may be said to have a common destiny, ultimate ground, or orientation in the same ultimate reality. The claims of the second type do not clearly assert a cognitive relationship but seem to suggest one. Examples would include proposals asserting that the great religions "at their experiential roots" are "in contact" with the same ultimate reality or those affirming that the same God is "sought after" in all religions. Claims of the third type, however, do clearly assert cognitive relationships when they declare that the major religious traditions "refer to," "speak in their different ways of," "describe differently," or "disclose" a single God or ultimate reality. Hallett collates numerous quotations to illustrate the rich variety of ways in which claims of all three types are expressed and how widely they are endorsed by contemporary scholars.

The difference between non-cognitive and cognitive identity claims can be illustrated by way of analogy. The assertion that the sun is the common source for plant growth, suntans, heat waves, and the northern lights is a merely causal claim and thus non-cognitive. It is easy to see how such different phenomena can be produced by a single source. The pluralist analogue is the assertion that a single reality is present in or influences the world's religions. This is a plausible claim but it does not do much to foster the practical goal of many pluralists -- increased mutual understanding, tolerance, and cooperation among the religions. After all, one could affirm that a single deity or ultimate reality works in different religions but also believe that it works differently in each religion, giving some advantages over others. Or one could acknowledge a single cause at work in many religions but also endorse the distinctive teachings of a particular religion as exclusively true and the only way to fully experience human flourishing or salvation, thereby providing impetus to proselytism. Thus, pluralists generally go further and make stronger, cognitive identity claims. Most common are versions of the idea that the world's religions (or at least the major religions) revere a single divinity or reality under different names.

Within the world's religions, YHWH, Allah, Vishnu, Tao, nirvana, etc. are described in quite different and often contradictory ways. Nonetheless, many pluralists assert that these terms have a single, identical referent; they are different names for the same transcendent reality. If true, this would be a significant insight. However, according to Hallett, this identity claim is analogous to saying that people refer to a single reality -- the sun -- when they describe northern lights, heat waves, suntans, and plant growth in quite different and contradictory ways. That would be an obviously wrong-headed thing to do. While each of these phenomena requires the sun, none of them are the same thing as the sun. To the contrary, the terms are used to refer to quite distinct phenomena appropriately distinguished from one another and from their common cause. If somebody were to seriously claim that each term refers to the sun by a different name, we would judge that he or she simply does not understand how these terms are used in the English language. So why not draw a similar conclusion with respect to analogous pluralist identity claims? For this reason Hallett finds identity claims of this sort odd. However, many intelligent people endorse them, suggesting that they merit further consideration. The significance of pluralism's purported benefits also warrants careful assessment.

As typically presented by advocates and detractors alike, pluralist identity claims appear meaningful and their assessment straightforward. Hallett argues otherwise. In addition to variance about the kind of relationship asserted, identity claims vary with regard to the realities identified (God, Krishna, Tao, Allah, nirvana, etc.) and the religions about which the claims are made (e.g., all religions, just the major world religions, individual pairings of religions). These variables make it difficult to thoroughly assess such claims since doing so would require the examination of hundreds of pairings. Instead of attempting that, Hallett recommends a strategic simplification of the issue by focusing on (1) the most significant type of relationship asserted (cognitive) and (2) ultimate realities that bridge the personal-impersonal distinction. As a test case, he considers Buddhism with its multiple impersonal ultimates and Christianity with its single personal deity. The question naturally arises: by selecting impersonal Buddhist ultimates for comparison with the Christian God, are the dice being loaded against pluralist identity claims? Hallett anticipates the question:

if Buddhism, one of the world's major religions, is in fact an exception to pluralist generalizations, then not only are the generalizations false but the arguments adduced in their support are invalid. The pluralist claims cannot be saved simply by admitting an exception in this major instance. (p. 28)

He is correct about this. However, it should be noted that even if pluralism in its most robust form fails, successful identities might still be established between particular pairings of religions or types of religions (e.g., those that revere a single personal deity). Moreover, exclusivist claims are not vindicated merely if it can be shown that global pluralism fails.

Hallett considers the conditions for successful reference in general and transcendent reference in particular. In the everyday world reference can be made via ostension (pointing at something) or accurate description. But it is not possible to point at a transcendent entity to establish reference. One could establish that two terms for transcendent realities refer to the same thing by means of accurate description. But the pluralist thesis alleges that the descriptions believers give to God, nirvana, sunyata, dharmakaya, etc. are all inaccurate. This presents a prima facie challenge to pluralist identity claims, but perhaps one that is surmountable. Several arguments for and against identical reference are considered in light of the various ways in which we use language to refer. None are found successful.

In the second half of the book (chapters 6-10), attention abruptly shifts away from the plausibility or truth of pluralist identity claims to the more basic question of their meaning (or lack thereof). This is not the poor transition of an author impatient to move on to the next topic. Rather, Hallett intends to startle the reader as he attempts to reorient the entire academic discussion about religious pluralism. Whereas nearly everyone writing on the topic attempts to assess the veracity of identity claims, they uniformly fail to establish that the claims are even meaningful. Given the oddity about pluralist identity claims noted earlier, Hallett contends that the question of meaningfulness is more pressing than the question of veracity and prerequisite to it.

Pluralists claim that the world's religions use a variety of names to refer to the same ultimate reality. The descriptions given to the purported single referent of these names vary widely, but somehow, pluralists assure us, they succeed in naming the same reality. But what type of "sameness" is in view? Hallett observes that both the question of identity and the question of individuation can be discussed in terms of sameness and often the two are conflated. The identity question asks if x and y are identical; the prior individuation question asks what makes the x an x. The identity question is vacuous if there are no individuating criteria whereby one can individuate the terms being related. If one asks whether the Christian God and nirvana are the same, one needs to reply with the question, "The same what?" If the answer is "The same thing" or "The same reality," then we need to know what criteria can be employed to individuate transcendent things, realities, ultimates, etc. We can identify individuating criteria for books, rivers, objects, etc. that allow us to ask meaningful questions of identity about whether we are dealing with the "same" book, river, or object. We can do this because there are readily discernable criteria that pertain to particular classes and categories. However, these criteria vary widely and there do not appear to be any generic criteria that hold for all classes of things.

By means of a nuanced Wittgensteinian analysis, Hallett convincingly demonstrates that pluralist identity claims are vacuous in the absence of individuating criteria for the kinds of referents the pluralist seeks to identify. The claims, then, are neither true nor false but rather they are meaningless. This invalidates the entire pro-and-con debate that dominates the literature. For, the question of sameness just does not make sense at the level required for interfaith comparisons. An answer to the identity question requires criteria of individuation for "beings," "realities," and "things" in general, and there just are no such criteria.

Demonstrating the meaninglessness of pluralist identity claims as they are currently formulated is the chief achievement of this book. Hallett, however, is not content to let the matter rest there without deeper probing. The final chapters address several misgivings people may have about Hallett's conclusion or method, discuss implications of his analysis that some might find troubling in other areas of inquiry, and explore possible remedies to the problems he has identified. As might be expected, Hallett does not find any of the misgivings to pose a serious objection to his conclusions. Nor does he find that any of the remedies he explores work.

Still not content to dismiss religious pluralism and its benefits, Hallett concludes the book with an interesting suggestion. Perhaps pluralism itself can be reformulated in terms of apt comparisons and parables. Rather than trying to defend the meaningfulness and veracity of cognitive identity claims, Hallett suggests that pluralists should instead compare religious experiences and determine the degree to which the experiences within different religions converge. Clearly, Hallett attempts to give pluralism every chance of success, but he does not sound optimistic about the chances of success for this alternative strategy.

Throughout the book, Hallett's discussions of language and reference are clear, nuanced, and informed by many years of thinking about the issues. But absent is the technical jargon sometimes employed by linguistic philosophers. This makes the book especially serviceable for use with students, though Hallett's concise writing style may require them to read some passages twice. Especially noteworthy are comments Hallett makes in various places about the famous analogy of an elephant being felt by blind men. They are nuanced and rich, worth one's time to read but impossible to summarize in a review. All in all, this book is a fine example of Wittgensteinian linguistic analysis that aptly illustrates its potential to clarify important philosophical issues while avoiding the excesses sometimes associated with the approach.