Onto-Cartography: An Ontology of Machines and Media

Placeholder book cover

Levi R. Bryant, Onto-Cartography: An Ontology of Machines and Media, Edinburgh University Press, 2014, 300pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780748679973.

Reviewed by Bryan E. Bannon, Merrimack College


Throughout the history of Western philosophy, there has been a minority tradition that has sought to base ontology upon relations rather than upon substances. Many of Levi Bryant's ideas in this book emerge from an engagement with contemporary exponents of this position, especially the work of Gilles Deleuze and Félix Guattari. The twist in the story Bryant tells, however, comes from his attempt to reframe these ideas in terms of a materialist philosophy with many of the qualities of a traditional substance ontology. The substantialist and relationist positions, historically, have not sat well together, and so I was intrigued by Bryant's attempts to make them compatible. Overall, though, his argument left me with more questions than answers about the value of this approach. In what follows, I will explain why via an examination of Bryant's arguments in favor of his onto-cartographical approach with an eye toward two distinct themes that run throughout: the competing ontological commitments to a substance-based and a more relational ontology and the political consequences of the ontology, with a specific reference to Bryant's thoughts on agency.

At the onset, Bryant describes his central task as a defense of materialism (1). The materialism he seeks to defend is "unabashedly naïve," by which he means,

that the world is composed of physical things such as trees, rocks, planets, stars, wombats, and automobiles, that thought and concepts only exist in brains, on paper, and in computer data banks, and the ideas can only be transmitted through physical media such as fiber optic cables, smoke signals, oxygen rich atmospheres, and so on. (6)

As reiterated throughout, however, Bryant wishes to remain agnostic about the nature of matter. On his view, there may even be different kinds of matter, but the important thing is that everything that exists has some kind of material embodiment (6), a contention that did not strike me as particularly contentious within contemporary philosophy.

Calling itself "a work of 'meta-politics' or 'meta-ethics,'" the book is an attempt to lay out an ontological foundation for political action (8). To do so, Bryant envisions "porting" -- the process in software engineering whereby a program's code is adapted in such a way to make it operate in a different computing environment -- most modes of philosophical critique into the language of onto-cartography (8). In other words, the thought is that diverse modes of critique may be more effectively rendered through the methods and language of onto-cartography. Given the emphasis upon and valorization of difference within most of the critical perspectives he mentions, the prospects for introducing this kind of homogeneity of approach and language are somewhat dubious, and there was no argument proffered as to why such homogeneity would even be desirable beyond the claim that increased attention to materiality will allow for an easier translation from idea to practice. Given the prevalence of specific analyses of material practices in the fields of critique he identifies, one wonders who, exactly, the target is here.

Those reservations aside, the basic concept of this ontological foundation is that of the machine. Everything that exists is one, and the first three chapters are devoted to elaborating their nature. The concept of a machine is meant to replace the traditional language of "substance," "body," "object," and "thing" in a more politically efficacious way (15). The reason for the change is twofold: 1) the concept of a machine "admirably captures the essence of entities as beings that function or operate" and 2) by conceptually replacing "object" in specific, it avoids the oppositional definition with "subject," "allowing us to step outside a four hundred year old philosophical obsession with interrogating the relationship between subjects and objects" (15). I would have appreciated a more detailed defense of this transition, especially since the terms "subject" and "object" return in a different capacity later.

Bryant defines a machine as "a system of operations that performs transformations on inputs thereby producing outputs" (38). Machines are defined by their "virtual proper being" and their "local manifestations." In his own words:

The virtual proper being of a machine is the operations of which it is capable. These constitute the 'proper being' of the machine in that machines are what they are capable of doing. They are 'virtual' in the sense that a machine can possess these operations without exercising them. (40-41)

The operations of which a machine is capable are its powers, and powers are said to have five qualities: 1) directedness toward a manifestation, 2) an independence from that manifestation (i.e., they do not need to be apparent to exist), 3) actuality (i.e., they exist as real, not as potential), 4) they are intrinsic to the machine that possesses them, and 5) they are therefore objective insofar as they exist regardless of any other machine's detecting them (41-2). When a power is exercised, the result is a local manifestation of the power. A local manifestation of a power is "nothing more than the product or output of an operation" (42). In many ways, the difficulties I describe below stem from this description of powers, which favors the traditional substance ontology insofar as it defines capabilities as actual, intrinsic, and objective.

One of Bryant's central questions is how machines function and associate. He believes that machines have been misunderstood as being "rigid," that is, as fixed in their function (16), so he describes them as "plastic," taking on and leaving behind functions as they enter into diverse relations (24). This plasticity is one of the key features of a relational ontology. For this to be possible, a machine must be structurally open to its environment (54). At the same time, that machines enter into relations with one another does not entail the claim that is frequently found in discussions of ecology, namely that "everything is related to everything else," since machines remain insensitive to the majority of machines surrounding them at any given time. Occasionally, machines that are removed from one another in this way can be brought into relation by a third machine, and when machines fulfill this role they are called "media" (9, 22, 31). When machines interact through media, the transformations that result are processed through the structural openness of the media machine, which is why machines' second feature, their operational closure, is important. Operational closure refers to the manner in which machines process the inputs they encounter: it means, "a machine never relates to a flow as it is, but rather always transforms that flow according to the internal structure of the machine" (56). In this way, machines possess a perspective of sorts: because they are open to their environments in specific and determinate ways, they can only process those inputs in equally determinate ways.

If done with care, it may then be possible to enter into this perspective and perform what Bryant calls, following Ian Bogost, "alien phenomenology." By examining the form the openness a given machine takes, observing the specific nature of the transformations it performs upon the inputs that affect it, and suspending one's own aims and purposes, it is possible to infer what it is like to experience the world as the other machine experiences it (62-64). This approach is thought to create greater compassion (70) and, when practiced upon a machine such as an institution, to increase our political efficacy (71-72). I see no intrinsic connection between such a perspective and an increase in compassion, a skepticism confirmed by Bryant's choice of an example of greater sensitivity to alien perspectives: "less traumatic" ways of slaughtering cows (65, 67-68, 71). More compassionate might be not to slaughter them at all, but mapping alien phenomenologies itself does not determine whether one will respond with compassion or be used to create increasingly efficient means of domination.

As Bryant points out, "there is no such thing as a simple machine" (75), so the operations of which the machine is capable will be determined by the kinds of machines that compose the higher order machine. This is a standard position of a relational ontology. For example, how my body digests food is a result of the operations of the machines (i.e., stomach, heart, colon, etc.) that compose my body. Because machines are complex, Bryant distinguishes between essential parts, which are those relations that can be altered or changed without changing the kind of machine in question, and inessential parts, which can be altered while leaving the machine's identity intact (76).

Here is the site of one of the major tensions in the book. At some points, Bryant maintains the relational position that this virtual proper being itself is not fixed (45, 150-1), while at others, he maintains the substantialist position that it is a sort of "reservoir of potential qualities, actions, and products in excess of whatever qualities, activities, or products happen to manifest at any given point in time and space" (106, 153), i.e., powers are actual and intrinsic to the machine. While it is possible that there is no tension between these two determinations (there is a reservoir, and what it contains changes and alters over time), this interpretation seems to be at odds with the stated goal of introducing the concept, namely, to preserve the identity of the machine throughout its various alterations occurring via its interacting with other machines (181). After all, if a machine is its operations, and its operations are determined by its powers, and its powers are constitutive of its virtual proper being, the only way for a machine to remain the same machine throughout its changes in relations is for its virtual proper being to remain defined. If the virtual proper being can change over time, this means the powers of the machine also change, meaning that the operations are different and one thus has a different machine. The problem here isn't necessarily with the ontological concepts, but I would have liked Bryant to be clearer about how the identity of a machine is determined (i.e., how does one determine which parts are essential and why maintaining the strict discreteness of machines is so important to him). To be clear, the issue is not necessarily with individuating beings in terms of their powers, but in wanting to maintain that position alongside the discreteness and non-relationality of machines.

The same issue arises again when it comes to differentiating machines from worlds, or ecologies of machines. Bryant defines a world as "a loosely coupled assemblage of machines interacting with one another through the mediation of other machines in an ecology" (113-114) or, alternatively, "an ecology of loosely coupled machines liked by machines without any of these machines totalizing world" (114, emphasis removed). Worlds, of which there are a plurality (116), are distinguished from machines because the relations within a world can be undone without destroying the ecology. In contrast, machines harbor internal relations that, if decoupled, will result in the destruction of the machine (123).

There is a certain lack of precision involved in determining which elements are essential to a machine and which are not, however. In many everyday examples, this may be easy to determine: when I drop a coffee mug and it shatters upon the kitchen floor, that machine is destroyed (the powers of its virtual proper being are no longer present), but the world remains the same, especially if I have other mugs. In other cases, however, the situation is trickier. Consider the dilemma in the film Whose Life Is It Anyway?: a sculptor, Ken, is in a car crash and is paralyzed from the neck down. Determining his life is no longer worth living due to his loss of powers, he desires to be euthanized. Putting aside the ethical issues this situation raises, we could also ask whether Ken is or is not the same "machine" as before. Bryant's view doesn't offer clear guidance here: on the one hand, the loss of virtual powers seems to indicate that Ken is a different machine, having lost something essential (at least by Ken's own determination) of himself. On the other hand, though Ken has certainly lost powers, he also seems to be the same "machine" insofar as there is a mental and bodily continuity between the pre- and post-accident Ken. Which perspective one takes up here will be a product of how one determines what is and is not an essential power to a machine, but we aren't given an effective way of determining this given that the dispute concerns whether Ken is or is not the same "machine." Since Bryant wants to maintain the discreteness of machines for political reasons, in what cases are we dealing with a change in kind rather than just moving between different sets of hidden powers in one's virtual proper being? Since we cannot know what powers lurk in the virtual proper being of a machine, is there any real way to know when a machine has altered its being? Is knowing this really politically important? I would have liked clearer answers to these questions.

I stress this tension between the competing demands of the two approaches to ontology because the viability of Bryant's view rests upon harmonizing them. On the one hand, he is firmly against both defining the essence of a machine in terms of its relations and ignoring the role that relations play in forming the virtual proper being of machines (181-82). In fact, these are two of the three ethical prescriptions of onto-cartography -- the third is simply to "be cautious" in one's interactions. However, it remains unclear whether he can maintain the actual, objective, and intrinsic nature of powers (the substantialist position) while also maintaining the plasticity of machines, that their powers are relational, without positing virtual proper being as the essence of each machine in the manner of Leibniz's monad: a complete list of all the possible relations of which a machine is capable that would exist prior to the encounter of that machine with the others that will bring the hidden power to the fore. The Deleuzian position on this subject is more sensible: the virtual is wholly indeterminate and is made actual in the specific relations a machine enters into. In many ways, Bryant develops his view out of what I take to be a misunderstanding of Deleuze and Guattari's position on relationality (46-8): their point is less that there are necessary relations and more that nothing exists apart from its constitution via relations with other things, and virtual powers are made determinate through those relations.

So, what is at stake in this ontological reformulation? Bryant uses his understanding of machines and their relations to argue that the philosophical conception of agency at use in a great deal of political and moral philosophy is outdated (175). When we observe the operations of a machine, we tend to attribute their local manifestation to it alone rather than examine the network of relations that are necessary to the production of that manifestation and thereby fail to acknowledge the diversity of operations necessary to make that manifestation possible (179); this point is a standard one from a relational perspective. Much like President Obama in his infamous "you didn't build that" speech, Bryant demands the recognition of these background agencies that make possible individual machines' local manifestations. Those familiar with Bruno Latour's "slight surprise of action" will find this idea familiar insofar as agency is always something distributed throughout a network (180). In this way, analysis of the ecology of machines' interactions within a world form the basis of a post-human social theory (192): nonhuman operations are just as necessary as human operations in bringing about a given state of affairs in the world, and humans are not even necessary for most states of affairs.

The political project of Onto-Cartography comes to the fore in mapping out how the ecology of worlds structures the agency of machines (197). Here is where "objects" return in Bryant's materialism: a machine is an object "whenever it is mediated by another object or mediates other objects" (197-98). He then develops a taxonomy for the different types of objects that exist (199-211). While space does not permit me to explain the relationships between each of the six kinds of objects, I will note that Bryant does not believe that any given machine is essentially any one kind of object, since the function of a machine within an ecology determines the kind of object it is and that function is subject to change. Thus, the purpose of the system of classification is to understand how best to intervene in a world "in ways that might render other more satisfying, more just, more sustainable, assemblages possible" (211).

To accomplish this goal, it is necessary to return to the conception of agency operant. While agency was earlier said to be distributed throughout networks, Bryant also wants to maintain that it is only present within a subset of machines. There are two requirements: 1) "a machine is an agent if it is able to initiate action from within itself" (219) and agents "must have the capacity to act otherwise than they do in initiating the action or in response to a stimulus" (220). From this definition Bryant draws three main consequences: that agency comes in degrees and is mutable since these powers are present in varying degrees and change over time, that there are more agents in the world than are usually recognized, and that such a conception of agency requires a reworking of the concept of responsibility (220-23).

The final chapter brings together the two major themes I have been tracing here, the individuation of machines through their virtual proper being and how relations between machines render an alternative conception of agency, in order to advance the final articulation of the onto-cartographical framework. Here Bryant describes three different ways to practice the mappings of onto-cartography, either via a basic cartography, deconstruction, or "terraformation." Cartography in general can be of several different kinds: the mapping of assemblages of machines and worlds (topography, 259), an analysis of how a particular ecology of relations came to be (genetic mapping, 263), charting the specific directionality or trajectory of evolution within a given ecology (vector mapping, 264), or a mapping of the different futures that a given ecology makes possible (modal mapping, 266). Deconstruction is the attempt to sever the relations between machines that sustain a particular ecology within a world, and terraformation is the construction of a new map, the speculation of a distinct ecology that previously did not exist.

These different ways of representing relations are oriented toward three distinct aims: 1) calling attention to the ways non-human machines participate in human worlds and form ecologies independently of us (279-80), 2) redefining social relationships as ecologies (280-81), and 3) returning to the analysis of concrete and specific relations rather than so-called abstract terms such as "racism" and "patriarchy" (258, 282). These shifts, in turn, are to lead us toward two distinct kinds of political critique, the normative and the cartographical. Normative politics involves the creation of a plan to transform an ethical system into actualities in the world, while cartographical politics involves a description of how and why relations are structured in the way they are, much in line with Foucault's genealogy (283).

Bryant's book contains many laudable ideas, and he is to be applauded for attempting to write a major work of philosophy. The kind of synthetic, big picture thinking he deploys is somewhat rare. Ultimately, however, the massive amount of new vocabulary he introduces is rather confusing because it simultaneously is intended to replace extant concepts and continues to utilize those same concepts the new vocabulary is meant to replace. While this difficulty is not necessarily a problem in itself, it does cause a certain amount of lexical imprecision; a concept may be used in a novel, technical sense in one chapter only to slide back to its traditional meaning in the next. In other cases there are slight contradictions, leaving the reader to puzzle out how to make them consistent. In general, the book would be significantly improved, especially given its stated unifying purpose, by utilizing its vocabulary more systematically, eliminating redundancies and contradictions, and avoiding the terms it eschews.

The more grievous flaw, however, is that the book never delivers on its unifying promise by providing the ultimate justification for why this framework is necessary. Many of the figures discussed possess similar concepts and methods, and their frameworks are already in broad use across the humanities and social sciences. While it is clear how the analyses Bryant describes are helpful to political critique and action, it was not clear why he thought these goals were not being met currently or how introducing his specific vocabulary was going to bring new life to, say, feminism or environmentalism. The frameworks of Foucault or Latour could equally well serve the purposes Bryant described, both of whom develop their ideas with specific reference to the materiality of bodies and the interactions between signifying systems and bodies.[1] Why the terminology of "machines" is going to be more convincing than "bodies" when referring to the materiality of beings is unclear.

To an environmental philosopher, the term calls to mind works such as Carolyn Merchant's The Death of Nature and Daniel Botkin's The Moon in the Nautilus Shell in which much of our poor relationship to nature derives from our metaphorically likening nature to a great machine.[2] Although Bryant's machines do not operate in the same manner as they do in, say, the Modern period, it is nevertheless the case that nature, on his view, remains a composite of machines organized in a functional system (15). Statements such as "Worlds are everywhere composed of factories where production in an infinite variety of forms ceaselessly takes place" do not inspire confidence that we are breaking with the conception of nature deemed problematic in the majority of environmental thought (39). Especially if the goal is to separate ourselves from an industrialist framework (be it Marxist or capitalist in orientation), describing worlds in terms of machines and calling it a functional, factory system does not seem to be in line with the values of many forms of critique Onto-Cartography seeks to unify.

[1] Bryant dismisses Foucaultian critique because "discussions of the role played by technology and non-humans in the formation of social ecologies is severely underdetermined" (285). To anyone who has read Discipline and Punish or any of the History of Sexuality series, this statement will come as a great surprise. While Bryant is careful in explaining the ideas of theorists whose ideas he utilizes, his engagement with and commentary upon other philosophers can be cursory and contain inaccuracies regarding the philosopher in question's ideas.

[2] Carolyn Merchant, The Death of Nature (San Francisco: Harper & Row, 1980); Daniel Botkin, The Moon in the Nautilus Shell (New York: Oxford, 2012).