Ontology after Onto-theology: Plurality, Event, and Contingency in Contemporary Philosophy

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Gert-Jan van der Heiden, Ontology after Onto-theology: Plurality, Event, and Contingency in Contemporary Philosophy, Duquesne University Press, 2014, 340pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780820704722.

Reviewed by Peter Gratton, Memorial University of Newfoundland


There is no shortage of books declaring an end to the philosophies of hermeneutics and deconstruction. This book provides its own eulogy of a sort given the "renewed interest in first philosophy or ontology" by leading thinkers in Continental philosophy (1). Mentioning the work of Alain Badiou and the speculative realists in particular, this ontological thinking, Gert-Jan van der Heiden argues, is salutary for bringing to the fore perennial questions about the meaning of existence occluded by decades of literary-style readings and interpretations of major traditional texts, without thinkers stepping out on their own to wager anything about the nature of the world. But rather than the rejection of certain thinkers found in the new realisms, readers of Ontology after Onto-theology will find Heidegger, Derrida, et al. brought to bear on the problems announced in the subtitle, namely how to think plurality, events, and contingency without being pulled back within onto-theology, that is, without having one's ontology presupposing a given archē or ground (God, matter, etc.) as the ultimate arbiter of existence (2-4). The present book is wide-ranging and provides an important contribution to debates about the direction of Continental philosophy. Given the limits of this review, I will move only among several of van der Heiden's readings, though the reader should understand that this book is a rich starting point for those thinking alongside Heidegger, Meillassoux, Agamben, and others regarding contemporary problems of ontology.

Van der Heiden investigates the possibilities for ontology after ontotheology along what he calls three axes.  First,there is the question of the one and the many (plurality), which means engaging the differences between the mathematical ontology of Badiou and the ontology found in the poetics of Heidegger and the work of Jean-Luc Nancy (chapters one and two). Second, the oft-discussed topic of the event through the work on contingency in Heidegger, Meillassoux, and Claude Romano (chapters four through six).  Third, the practical comportment that follows from the first two discussions, which is the basis for the concluding seventh chapter.

To my mind, this chapter is disappointing.  It tries to find a hermeneutic means for affirming Agamben's call for "pure potentiality," a concept that gets much fanfare in the literature.  But like the Bartlebyesque "I prefer not" that is its exemplar, it can only affirm absolute indecision, an "epochē " -- to use one of the author's favored phenomenological terms -- from the spaces of action that is but an analogue of a thinking that steps back from the world that the author also privileges throughout. This misses the crucial point about the critique of ontotheology, namely that one cannot step back to a point before historicity, and thus any ontology after ontotheology, at least as Heidegger, Derrida, and Levinas differently noted, must begin from an engaged praxis, from the very emplacement of one's thinking. Inasmuch as the new realisms and speculative movements absolve themselves of this emplacement and temporalization, they provide another step back to the safe confines of ontotheological theōria, a point to which I'll return.

The task "after ontotheology," as van der Heiden takes it, is to think against its privileging of unity as well as the principle of sufficient reason. In chapter one, he takes up Badiou's mathematical ontology as providing one important mode of thinking the relation among plurality, the event, and the comportment one should have toward them (29-30). Badiou is a realist about mathematics, taking as axiomatic both that mathematics is ontology and that any given event is irreducible to any previous ontological scheme. The subject is what it is only by being faithful and militant to the truth of this previously unforeseen event. Van der Heiden argues that this means that Badiou's subject is always backwards-looking. But this misses the temporality at play in his account and allows, incidentally, van der Heiden to make a bit-too-easy distinction between thinkers of the event who affirm the past (Badiou, Nietzsche, and the past of creation and birth in Romano) and those who are future oriented (Levinas, Heidegger, and Derrida). For Badiou, though, we act, if at all, in the temporality of the future anterior. The political subject, on his account, acts according to a working fiction "as if" the event had already occurred (and thus the subject of the event is in no simple way backward looking or affirmative of a given past), and in this way the subject of the event may never in the end know if it even indeed has taken place. This epistemic ambiguity for the subject is an important element of Badiou's theory. Indiscernible, the subject must "force" through courageous discipline after the event the circumstances such that the event will have taken place. As is well known, the paradigmatic moment of revolutionary action, on Badiou's account, is the act of "nomination" in which a revolutionary group names and brings about performatively the event this naming entails. This nomination is a "subtraction" of the new from the current "set" of circumstances. Ontology thus not only describes what is present or ready to hand but also politically intervenes in a given set of conditions.

What guides van der Heiden's critique of Badiou is his axiomatic "decision" that the "one is not," since Badiou "cannot account for the necessity of his own choice for the existence of the many," any more than ontotheology can demonstrate its own necessary beginning in the decision that, say, "the one is" (265). Meanwhile, van der Heiden argues, despite this decision, Badiou's reliance on mathematics absolves the decision of "fear and trembling" -- since it is founded onto-mathematically, not in terms of an abyss or failure of ground that the subject would face (64).  I agree somewhat on this point but wonder if van der Heiden is wishing to have logical necessity at the foundation of Badiouian philosophy while elsewhere linking all forms of necessity to metaphysics and ontotheology. While I'm no apologist for Badiou, his closest affinity to post-metaphysical thought is less in his ontology (wedded as it is to an avowed Platonism) than to his attempt to think the decision (and thus performativity) that is the heart of any philosophical system and cannot be disavowed.

The second chapter takes up the work of Nancy, who has affirmed plurality not just at the level of texts, as with the hermeneutic philosophers before him, but ontologically (70). For Nancy, "as conditioned being, our being is always already being-with and being-in-common with others and other beings" (73). Comparing Nancy and Badiou, van der Heiden argues that while both the subject and the ontological are singular-plural in Nancy, the subject in Badiou is faithful to one truth that marks him or her and the event. Chapter three builds on this critique by looking to different renderings of Plato's Parmenides in Nancy and Badiou, with the former demonstrating that Plato's thought can be said to find a thinking of ontology without presuppositions. This epoché or presuppositionless thinking provides a model of sorts for Agamben's "Bartleby, the Scrivener," whose potentiality without presupposition is found in his preference not to.

As these chapters makes clear, van der Heiden is still affirmative of the hermeneutic methods he developed well in The Truth (and Untruth) of Language: Heidegger, Ricoeur, and Derrida on Disclosure and Displacement (Duquesne UP, 2010). He is thus far from the speculative type of writing found, e.g., in Meillassoux's After Finitude (2007). In part two of the book, he turns again to Heidegger, who is his interlocutor throughout. His task, as I take it, is to render Heidegger palatable to those who would, like Meillassoux, dub him a correlationist, that is, only able to think being in terms of human Dasein. The many sections on Heidegger, while occasionally critical, show that any contemporary considerations of event and contingency cannot disavow a lineage to Heidegger's post-Sein und Zeit writings, about which van der Heiden is at his best. In reading the letters of Paul through Badiou and Heidegger, van der Heiden finds that while Heidegger divorces questions of faith from philosophy, Badiou's Paul provides a dangerous model: "Can we truly be claiming to be thinking when we behave like a religious believer or a political militant in the service of some higher truth? Does Badiou's work not run the risk of effacing one crucial aspect of thought, namely its withdrawal from the world?" (177). To this, he counterposes what he takes to be the stances of Heidegger and Agamben, namely, that the event (of Paul) may only be a change in Dasein's comportment, not in the world itself, a claim he says is found in Agamben's thesis that the coming of the Messiah would be the "revocation of every vocation," that is, a move to pure potentiality with no ergon or function for the community or the individual (176).

The remainder of the book takes up Romano's phenomenology of the event, Meillassoux's speculative materialism, and Agamben's thinking of abandonment and pure potentiality. For reasons of space, I'll focus on his rendering of Meillassoux and his relation to Agamben, where van der Heiden accounts for a thinking of potentiality that is supposedly radical and post-ontotheological, though I'm unconvinced. For example, Meillassoux's views on the event are said to be similar to Heidegger's, since the event for both is the irruptive coming that cannot be linked to the previous in terms of the principle of sufficient reason. In a like manner, Meillassoux's account of the lack of laws of the universe, since change can happen at any given time, is said to be similar to what Agamben calls contingency. Meillassoux famously disallows the principle of sufficient reason in After Finitude, but his view of the future is one that is always held in potential, from the present. That is, the future God to come that is the subject of Meillassoux's later essays, is not the Ereignis as wholly other in Heidegger, but is rather quite foreseeable from the present, and thus is anything but a future beyond the future-present. The world to come, Meillassoux avers, would have to be a communist one to be worthy of the name "world," and is one in which a future God provides for the material equality of one and all. This is precisely a thinking of the future as the "future present" critiqued as on the side of the metaphysics of presence in Heidegger, Levinas, and Derrida.

In this way, Meillassoux should be taken at his word to be a pre-Kantian -- and thus ontotheological -- thinker. Any possibility on his account would be an actualization of a future present -- and this is not a thinking of potentiality otherwise than in the tradition, or at least I would need much more on this score to be convinced. But it's also the case that Meillassoux's speculative school begins from theōria to devise a given praxis (even if one can't help but wonder if Meillassoux's thought of a future God could only lead to quietism -- if I have to wait for the divine justice, why bother?). This differs from the so-called "post-ontotheological" thinkers enumerated in this book, who attempt to rethink the human/world relation not in terms of a theoretical engagement, but as a form of praxis. This will strike many writers sympathetic to Meillassoux as a correlationist view: to depict the world only in terms of what is thought or practiced by human beings. But have we so rounded down different modes of thinking since Aristotle's delineation of sophia from nous from epistemé from phronésis such that we are only left with the calculative and atemporal thinking of the speculative philosopher? Praxis does not engage in the world as it is but is performative and inventive, and as such this should upend too-easy distinctions between the human or linguistic on the one side and ousia or being on the other.

This brings me back to the book's introduction, where van der Heiden affirms Arendt's late account in The Life of the Mind that "thinking concerns a withdrawal from the world of appearances" (20). Van der Heiden argues that Arendt's phenomenology of thought is a corrective to those who would rush into a given set of actions without forethought or throw out all theōria, given the critiques of Heidegger and the early Arendt, who privileged the life of action over the vita contemplativa. What van der Heiden wishes to acknowledge is not a theōria that contemplates the eternal, but is a step back from action, performing an "epochē of the affirmation and negation of existence in order to disclose being (and thinking) in its potentiality-to-be-otherwise" (21). This step back, I think, is akin to Agamben's idea of pure potentiality, but is also one, I fear, that always gives itself the sovereign right to claim one's hands clean of the world of action and politics. This is a politics that affirms nothing and hence negates everything, and thus could only ever be one that is theoretical in the most classical sense. Pace van der Heiden, though in admiration for what is an important book, I think the contingency of thought and being, as he lays it out, requires thinking from out of our temporalization and emplacement, from which an epochē is only ever a denial of the conditions of possibility for thought in the first place, along with the processes of patriarchy, racialization, economization and so on, that are its conditions, too, and cannot be suspended so easily as one is said to do with the past in these pages. Such an epochē, then, risks becoming an alibi for a type of philosophizing we have seen too much these past years, pretending a neutrality while not negotiating with traditions that it nevertheless repeats in often insidious ways.