Ontology and Analysis: Essays and Recollections about Gustav Bergmann

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Laird Addis, Greg Jesson, and Erwin Tegtmeier (eds.), Ontology and Analysis: Essays and Recollections about Gustav Bergmann, Ontos, 2007, 312pp., $139.95 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793695.

Reviewed by Edwin B. Allaire, University of Texas at Austin


The occasion for the essays in this collection was a Centennial honoring Gustav Bergmann (1906-1987), held in May 2006, at the University of Iowa. Three of the essays are reminiscences; nine are philosophical. The former speak mainly to Bergmann's power and influence as a teacher; the latter to various aspects of his philosophical views. All the essays are respectful, none are fawning, and none are particularly critical.

Two of the philosophical essays are largely historical. Guido Bonino insightfully examines two early essays by Bergmann in an attempt to understand the roots of his lifelong metaphysical, ontological quest. Franscesco Orilia thoroughly explores the differences between how Meinong and Bergmann deal with the Bradley regress. Donald Sievert has a neat exposition of Bergmann's treatment of synthetic a priori statements, a treatment that is curiously sterile since it completely ignores what underlies the problematic that inspires Kant's metaphysics and that leads Wittgenstein to abandon the Tractatus. Robert Baker writes on Bergmann as a historian of philosophy, more specifically, a structural historian, one who focuses on the spirit rather than on the letter of a text.

Bergmann is an ontologist, making and defending such claims as: there are particulars, there are universals, there are possible states of affairs and so on. The claims amount, initially, to remarks about the vocabulary of a formalism that is purportedly ideal in the sense that, first, one can translate everyday, factual language into it and, second, it supports the synthetic/analytic distinction. The defense of the claims could end there, in which case Bergmann would be a mere formalist, the ontological claims mere words about words. The genuinely ontological sense of the claims emerges when the basic vocabulary is said to stand for nonlinguistic entities. These claims are defended by arguing that one is acquainted with instances of the ontological kinds. Differently put, the ontological claims are phenomenologically grounded.

The essays by Ernani Magalhaes and William Heald address in differently ways, and with different concerns, claims about particulars: that there are such entities, that they are bare, and that 'there are particulars' expresses something thinkable but inexpressible. Particulars solve the individuation problem though their so doing is, strikingly, not the source of the claim that there are particulars. That claim flows from the formalism, from its vocabulary embodying a type distinction. Something similar is present in Aristotle's Categories. Primary substances are posited not to solve a philosophical problem but, speaking loosely, because of the grammar of the language. They nonetheless end up providing a solution to a philosophical problem, the identity of a thing through change. The bareness of particulars means merely that particulars do not determine what kinds of entities they can or must or do combine with in states of affairs. Universals are also bare in that sense. Put linguistically, one cannot infer the formation rules from the vocabulary. The early Wittgenstein disagreed, holding that there are different kinds of particulars and different kinds of properties, thereby allowing him to insist that certain particulars had to combine with certain kinds of universals.

'There are particulars' expresses that the ideal language contains descriptive constants of the zero type. That an entity is a particular "shows itself" by the type of the sign standing for it. That the statement is thinkable points to a very different matter. In interpreting the signs the philosopher has to coordinate the signs and entities properly. He or she needs a criterion for picking out the appropriate entity. This opens onto a deep confusion. The inexpressibility of an item's being a particular concerns the futility of introducing a sign for particularity into the ideal language. The thinkability of an item's being a particular concerns the philosopher's need to have a notion of particularity in order to interpret signs of the ideal language. In this context, 'this is a particular' is clearly expressible.

The "phenomenological" grounding of the interpretation of the ideal language into extralinguistic entities gives rise to dark questions. Does the philosopher really have standards for such terms as 'particular' and 'universal'? How are they acquired and what is there "in the entity" that allows the philosopher to "see" that the entity is entitled to be called a particular? Fred Wilson touches on these issues in "Placing Bergmann," a lengthy, grand tour of philosophers large and small, past and recent. Wilson's concern is to show that Bergmann remains a positivist (empiricist), notwithstanding the lavish ontology he is driven to develop over the years.

Greg Jesson's essay on Bergmann's quest for the ontology of knowledge provides a helpful account of Bergmann's treatment of so-called acts of thought. For example, a believing is a particular exemplifying a "proposition" that intends a possible state of affairs. A bit differently, a proposition carries within it the mark of that which will make it true: a proposition is a truth bearer and as such must "show" what would make it true. For Bergmann, an empiricist, knowledge must be more than a mental act, its account must incorporate experience, direct awareness as some would say. But this leads to an abyss. A direct awareness would have to be a relation between a particular and a state of affairs but could not itself be a case of knowing; it would be only a necessary condition for knowing. There would have to be a further act intending a proposition whose truth maker is a relatum of the direct awareness relation. There would also have to be an act intending both of those acts.

Wilson makes clear that acquaintance and direct awareness should be different. That is a good start; but the fact is that ontological claims, when placed in the context of interpretation, are likely to be conflated with ordinary claims that are alleged to be certain. How is one to understand a philosopher's claim that he or she knows that an entity is a particular or universal or whatever the case may be?

Erwin Tegtmeier's "The Development of Bergmann's Metaphysics" is composed of somewhat brief summaries of the stages in Bergmann's evolution from a metaphysical miser to a metaphysical spendthrift. Tegtmeier rightly stresses Bergmann's dialectical strength and his agonizing over each new kind of entity that had to be given ontic status. Tegtmeier also has an afterword to the volume, "Read Bergmann!", in which he claims that "there is no better way today to achieve metaphysical mastery than to read Bergmann, to read him closely”. That is sound advice, provided one believes that the ontological quest is for a perspicuous way to describe, or to say, "the" world with all the ontological commitments "showing themselves."