Ontology and the Art of Tragedy: an Approach to Aristotle's Poetics

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Husain, Martha, Ontology and the Art of Tragedy: an Approach to Aristotle's Poetics, State University of New York Press, 2002, 161 pp, $16.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-7914-5144-5.

Reviewed by Stephen Halliwell, University of St Andrews


This short but concentrated book makes a rigorous attempt to see Aristotle’s Poetics as fully embedded within the framework of Aristotelian ontology. Taking the philosopher’s entire corpus to be systematically unified by ‘substantive-methodological conceptual constants’, Husain argues that some of the most important of these constants (above all, the ontological/cognitive priority of primary substance, ousia, and the principle of form-matter constitution) can be traced at work, both explicitly and implicitly, within the Poetics. She presents as a schema of ontological levels the theoretical steps by which the treatise expounds a distinctive subject-matter through generic and specific conceptions of mimetic, i.e. representational, art. It does so, she believes, by presupposing – certainly not by spelling out, contrary to a common mistake about the work – Aristotle’s tenet that all human craft (techne) stands in a ‘mimetic’ relationship to nature (Husain calls this mimesis 1) and by defining ‘artistic’ techne generically in terms of its representational content (mimesis 2); poetic techne is then delimited in terms of its verbal (and related) materials, and tragic art further demarcated with reference to the special kind of action, embodied in the ‘structural-emotive’ entity of a tragic plot (mythos), that constitutes its being. All techne produces artificial substances that are analogous, in form-matter constitution and formal-final causality, to natural substances. Every tragedy is a substance with its own ontological imperative, independent of both its maker and its audience.

Husain’s approach to the Poetics brings with it three salient consequences. The first is that catharsis, because part of the formal definition of tragedy’s essence, is deemed a process of causal ‘clarification’ within the dramatic action, not the psychological effect of a play on an audience. The second is that Aristotle’s ‘severely selective emphasis on mythos’ (53), with its concomitant subordination of other elements of tragedy (including characterization), involves, according to Husain, a ‘profound refocusing’ (57) of the idea of action, and one that reflects sharp divergence between the perspectives of the Poetics and the Ethics: the action of the former, supposedly because of hamartia (which Husain treats very skimpily, 61-2), is an ‘impersonal causal agency’ (59) in which the characters of the human agents play no causal role (62), so that the agent-centered viewpoint of the Ethics is irrelevant to the interpretation of tragedy (‘ethical and tragic action are not only different but incompatible’, 87). The third consequence, overlapping with the second, is that the Poetics allegedly entails a clear separation between mimetic art and life: the standards of poetic art are entirely ‘autotelic’ and ‘objective’; only art, not life, can for Aristotle be ‘tragic’; there is ‘little that art can teach us about life’ (89). If that seems a paradoxical upshot for a reading of a work that frames poetry as the mimesis of life (Poetics 6.1450a16-17), Husain acknowledges the paradox but locates it in Aristotle’s position, not her own. I shall return to this issue.

This book is lucidly written and compactly reasoned. It wastes few words and manages to develop its thesis in a progressively interesting manner. Its arguments will repay close attention from anyone concerned with interpretation of the Poetics at an advanced level. Especially instructive is Husain’s sustained engagement with – indeed endorsement of – the markedly objectivist slant of Aristotle’s thinking about mimetic art. (Husain, incidentally, is happy to identify ‘mimesis 2’ with representation, e.g. 36, 47, but regrettably retains ‘imitation’ as her stock translation.) I have, however, serious qualms about two central planks of her case: first, her understanding of the place of pity and fear, and therefore catharsis, in the definition of tragedy; second, the breach that she posits between Aristotle’s understanding of tragic action in art and ethical action in life.

First, then, the seemingly inevitable crux of catharsis. Husain chooses not to discuss the matter head-on as an interpretative problem nor to contextualize her own stance vis-à-vis the long history of controversy surrounding the term (for which see my book, Aristotle’s Poetics, London, 1986/1998, appendix 5). Neither does she offer a philologically informed account of the catharsis clause itself. She introduces her view abruptly in an undefended translation of the clause as meaning: ‘achieving the clarification of how pitiful and fearsome actions cause like things to befall’ (42). To anyone familiar with the difficulties of the most notorious ten words in all Aristotle’s writings this translation is deeply perplexing: taken as a whole, it is linguistically impossible. It is one thing to translate katharsis itself as ‘clarification’ (others have done this, though à propos the audience’s understanding) or to take the noun pathematon to mean events (‘…things to befall’, though on 44 Husain explicitly renders the word as ‘afflictions’) rather than emotions (again not new, though a minority position). Even to take ‘pity and fear’ to mean ‘pitiful and fearsome actions’, though tendentious, is not unprecedented. Add these three things together, though, and one has an extreme interpretation that strains Aristotle’s Greek. But worst of all, Husain takes an instrumental use of the preposition dia (‘by means of (pity and fear)’) to have causal force, distorts the syntax of the clause grotesquely, and on this basis makes the catharsis clause denote ‘the clarification of the action’s sequential-causal structure (dia)’ (44). To make matters worse, her translation imports a peculiar emphasis (on pitiful/fearsome events causing other such events to befall) which she never explains and which I cannot match with Aristotle’s own arguments. Finally, not only does she ignore the much-cited parallel reference to catharsis in Politics 8.6-7, 1341a-2a (where it is a phenomenon, something undergone by the hearers of certain kinds of music, and pity and fear are specified as possible objects of it), she does not even admit its existence.

This last point is doubly telling. First, Husain constantly insists on the unity of the corpus and on interpreting ‘Aristotle from Aristotle’, yet she allows herself to ignore a passage in which Aristotle says that he intends to elucidate his concept of catharsis ‘in the Poetics’ (or, at the very least, in a discussion of poetry): what does this deliberate silence say about the cogency of Husain’s method? Secondly, while the Politics passage itself raises complex interpretative problems (for the best recent treatment see Richard Kraut, Aristotle Politics Books VII and VIII, Oxford, 1997, 208-12), what is beyond reasonable dispute is that its cross-reference to the/a Poetics establishes a connection between the concepts of catharsis in the two works, and therefore that catharsis in the Poetics has something to do with the experience of pity and fear by audiences and cannot be a wholly self-contained feature of tragic plot-structure.

If the evidence of the Politics counts heavily against Husain (without, I should stress, settling the whole question of what catharsis means in the Poetics), what can she pit against it? The answer is the following argument. Given the logic of definition in Aristotle, the catharsis clause must ‘fall under’ one of the three differentiae used in the definition of tragedy; that differentia can only be ‘action’, the central object of tragic mimesis (it cannot be either the materials or the dramatic mode of representation); and so catharsis cannot refer to the experience of the audience of tragedy, which is not part of the formal definition of the genre. Prima facie we face here a clash between a logical appeal to the protocols of Aristotelian definition and the unequivocal indications of a conceptual link supplied by a cross-reference in another Aristotelian treatise. Even if this were so, Husain’s total silence about the second part of the dilemma would be mystifying. As it is, there is nothing in Aristotle’s method of definition which, when adapted to an art form like tragedy (and it remains doubtful how ‘scientific’ a case of definition this is), prevents him from predicating essentially of the genre a capacity to arouse certain emotions in an (appropriately receptive) audience and by doing so achieve a result called catharsis, whatever exactly he understands by this last term. Husain is justified in believing, like many previous interpreters, that the emotive properties of tragedy are, for Aristotle, ‘objectively’ constitutive of its nature, but wrong to reason that emotive content is somehow self-sufficiently intrinsic to the artwork rather than a function of its normatively stipulated effect on a recipient. (The point could be elaborated with application to the role of pleasure in Aristotle’s theory.)

As it happens, another part of Politics 8 can be pertinently deployed to show what is one-sided about Husain’s view of the ‘structural-emotive’ status of tragic action. When Aristotle discusses music as a mimetic art at Politics 8.5, 1340a, he speaks of music’s ethico-emotional properties (ethika), its ‘likenesses’ to forms of human ethos, as properties ‘in’ the forms of the music but also necessarily realized in the experience of the hearer: ‘rhythms and melodies contain likenesses (homoiomata) … of ethical traits (ethika); this is clear in practice, since our state of mind is changed (metaballomen…ten psuchen) as we listen to such music.’ What this passage demonstrates is that for Aristotle there need not, indeed cannot, be an intrinsic/extrinsic dichotomy, of the kind Husain postulates, between the emotive properties of artworks and their experience by suitably attuned audiences. The Poetics’ account of tragedy accordingly presupposes an implicitly normative audience; there is no way Aristotle could make sense of ‘the pitiful’, however objectively defined, without such a presupposition. That this is indeed the logic of the tragic emotions in his argument is confirmed, to cite just one example, by 14.1453b1-7 (never discussed by Husain), where the emotive properties of a plot-structure are explicitly cashed out in terms of the relevant response on the part of an auditor – precisely parallel to the case of music in the Politics. Husain is right to maintain that Aristotle’s theory cannot be essentially dependent on actual audiences; but Aristotle also accepts the existence of properly sensitive, discerning audiences that give empirical support to the theory (see esp. 13.1453a26-30). Husain’s own partial assimilation of this point (63) comes too late to do justice to the interdependence of internal and external in Aristotle’s model of tragic emotions.

I move now to my second main disagreement with this book. Husain argues that while Aristotle’s ethical thought requires an agent-centered view of human life, the Poetics employs an object-centered view: ethical actions are derivative from the characters of their agents, but tragic action is quite different, centered on impersonal causality (59). Husain’s case here depends above all on Poetics chapter 8, where Aristotle criticizes the assumption that unity of poetic plot-structure can be secured by focus on a single agent as opposed to a single action (praxis). However, Husain over-interprets this contrast. The contrast states that a single, central character is neither sufficient nor necessary for unity of action, but it does not follow that it ‘sharply contrasts the agent-focused structure of life with the action-focused one of art’ (126 n. 18). Aristotle insists on a unified praxis as a ‘single object’ of poetic mimesis (Poetics 8.1451a30-32) and treats action in this depersonalized sense as the formal essence of a tragedy without thereby excluding ethical human agency from the domain of poetic representation. It is true, in other words, that the plot-structure of Oedipus Tyrannus is not, qua single, unified ‘action’, itself an exercise of ethical agency, but equally true that the play, in its entirety, remains a mimesis of ethical agents and action(s) (note Aristotle’s use of the plural praxeis at e.g. 1450a22, 1453b16, a detail consistently ignored by Husain). Nor does the contrast drawn in Poetics chapter 8 prevent Aristotle from framing his conception of the ideal tragedy, in chapter 13, specifically by reference to a certain kind of central agent (1453a7-12 – a point evaded by Husain, 62).

By eliding different senses or aspects of praxis in the Poetics Husain occludes the ethical implications of Aristotle’s broader conception of action(s) as the object of poetic representation. Husain asserts that even the Ethics’ vocabulary of the agent (ho pratton) is ‘absent’ from the Poetics, and, correlatively, that ‘ethical character appears in the plural (ethe) rather than in the singular (ethos) and disjoined from dianoia’. All this is misleading: (1) the vocabulary of ‘the agent(s)’ occurs as the object of mimesis at e.g. Poetics 1448a1, 1448a23-8, 1450a6, 1450b4; (2) ethos occurs in both singular and plural (with varying nuances, which Husain never considers) in the Poetics (for the singular see e.g. 1449b38, 1450a2, 1450a14, 1450a29, 1450b8), as it does also in the Ethics (for the plural there see e.g. 1121b6, 1127b23, 1145a16); (3) so far from being ‘disjoined’, ethos and dianoia are expressly coupled at Poetics 6.1449b36-50a2 (an important passage never discussed by Husain), which also shows that the mimesis of praxis in the Poetics actually implies the mimesis of agents, and agents, furthermore, who are, in the finest works, ethically characterized.

Where, then, does this leave Husain’s thesis that the Poetics opens up clear distance between ‘art’ and ‘life’ (and is right to do so)? The thesis legitimately identifies a point of tension in Aristotle’s theory, though such tension may be inescapable for any rich conception of mimesis, avoidable only by either reducing mimesis to the replication of life or attempting to affirm sheer autonomy for art. (See my new book, The Aesthetics of Mimesis: Ancient Texts and Modern Problems, Princeton, 2002.). Husain journeys in the second of these directions, but she balks at going all the way (see her belated remarks on art’s partial ‘similarity’ to life, 70-77, 103-5). Even so, the ‘autotelic’ status she ascribes to tragic and other artforms goes beyond Aristotle’s own carefully nuanced position; the distinctive poetic standards of Poetics 25 are not entirely severed from those of ‘life’. Observe here the peculiar language used in Husain’s claim that from an Aristotelian viewpoint ‘a work of art…is a self-referential, self-significant, and self-worthy analogue of a living animal’ (98, cf. 34). It would be hard to translate the compound adjectives in this proposition into Aristotelian terms: ‘self-referential’ in particular flatly contradicts the Poetics’ notion of mimesis as the representation of ‘life’. Husain does not in the end escape her own tensions: all artworks, she thinks, form an ‘auto-telic microcosm’ (107, her italics), independent of anything ‘extrinsic’; but the idea of a microcosm requires that of a macrocosm. An Aristotelian aesthetics is rooted in the hope that art can help its audiences to comprehend the forms and possibilities of the human world a little better (Poetics chapter 4, never confronted by Husain) – a hope not to be equated with ‘didacticism’ or a ‘mirror of life’ model, contrary to Husain’s briskly reductive depiction of readings different from her own (89-90).

A common thread in the criticisms sketched above is the thought that Husain pursues her approach so single-mindedly (as well as, at times, with a damagingly selective deployment of textual evidence) that she ends up being more ‘Aristotelian’ than Aristotle himself. By insisting on the supposed purity of certain methodological and conceptual principles, she misses the realistic suppleness of thought that is just as vital to Aristotle’s cast of mind as any individual doctrine.