Opting for the Best: Oughts and Options

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Douglas W. Portmore, Opting for the Best: Oughts and Options, Oxford University Press, 2019, 324pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190945350.

Reviewed by Leonard Kahn, Loyola University New Orleans


Philosophers are sometimes caricatured for offering unhelpful answers to difficult questions. For example, if asked, "What ought I to do?", we philosophers might say, "Do what matters most!" This answer seems problematic because it exchanges the original question for another -- what matters most? -- that is at least as challenging. Another thing that philosophers get caricatured for is teasing out the consequences of highly unlikely circumstances. Readers of this review will be all-too-familiar with imaginary brains-in-vats and runaway trolleys to need much of a reminder.

But what would happen if we embraced both of these caricatures? Suppose for one happy moment that we discovered what matters most and that we should do whatever most matters. Would that be enough to tell us what we ought to do? If so, we would not need Douglas W. Portmore's elegant, thoroughgoing, and painstakingly reasoned book. This project, based on a handful of previously published articles, is an attempt to articulate and resolve many of the thorny issues about what we ought to do that remain after we determine -- if we ever do -- what matters most. You should prioritize careful study of this book, if you are interested in obligation, moral responsibility, the philosophy of action, supererogation, suberogation, and outcomes that are either overdetermined or underdetermined, as well as outcomes that involve misdeeds in the future. But even those with merely adjacent interests will benefit from engaging with it.

Let me begin by sketching the contours of Portmore's project. Imagine that Sam finds herself in circumstances C. What ought Sam to do? Portmore believes that the answer to that question depends on three questions. He does not label them in the book, but it will be easier to track them if we do:

  1. The Option Question: What options are available to Sam in C?
  2. The Part/Whole Question: Which of the options available to Sam in C should be understood as wholes, and which of the options should be understood as proper parts of wholes?
  3. The Assessment Question: Should we evaluate Sam's options, or should we evaluate the prospects for Sam's options?

Let me unpack these questions a bit before diving a little more deeply into them later.

The Option Question comes into focus when we notice that, whatever Sam does, she might be able to do something better. Suppose that Sam can write a $1,000 check and send it to a highly effective NGO like the Against Malaria Foundation. Ought Sam to write the check? Before you answer, note that it is also possible for Sam to jot down the formula of a currently unknown chemical that will prevent plasmodium parasites from infecting humans when they are bitten by mosquitos, thereby averting all future cases of malaria. If what matters in this case is maximizing human flourishing -- a goal which would be promoted by preventing cases of malaria -- then it is better for Sam to jot down the formula than write the check. Why does one of these things seem like an option for Sam, but the other does not?

The Part/Whole Question arises because some options are proper parts of others. Imagine that Pat suffers an upper airway blockage and will die unless Sam performs a tracheotomy. However, performing a tracheotomy involves both (A) making an incision in Pat's neck and (B) opening an airway through the incision. So performing a tracheotomy has (A) and (B) as proper parts. But Sam believes that if she does (A) she will be so disgusted that she will not do (B), leaving the airway unopened and thereby increasing Pat's agony without saving her life. When determining what Sam ought to do, should we assess Sam's doing (A) in terms of its own value or in terms of the value of the tracheotomy as a whole? We require an answer to the Part/Whole Question to say.

Finally, the Assessment Question confronts us since we can think about what matters most either directly in terms of Sam's options or indirectly in terms of the prospects[1] of her options. Picture Sam considering whether or not she should take the last cookie from the cookie jar. Sam's mother has told her not to, and Sam also knows that if she takes the last cookie, then Pat will go hungry. So Sam ought not to take the last cookie. But why? Is it because Sam's mother has told her not to, or is it because Pat will go hungry? Portmore calls answers of the latter type "teleological" since they evaluate Sam's options in terms of the prospects for these options (e.g., Pat's going hungry) and denotes the former "non-teleological" because they look to the options themselves (e.g., forbidden by mom), rather than their prospects, for their moral status.

I suggest thinking of Portmore's book as a climb up a tall mountain with two major plateaus. The book's basecamp is an articulation and defense (in Chapter 1) of what Portmore calls the "Opting-for-the-Best View." A slogan version of this view is "Your options are a proper subset of all possible events, and you ought always to perform the best member of some (not necessarily proper) subset of your options" (p. 6).[2] The first plateau is Portmore's attempt (in Chapters 2 and 3) to answer the Option Question, and the second is the development (in Chapters 4 through 6) of his answer to the Part/Whole Question. The trip to the summit consists of his answer to the Assessment Question (Chapter 7). The book's final chapter is a brief view from the summit that seeks to show the unity of the journey and to reassess the surrounding landscape from these lofty heights.

Portmore's answer to the Option Question has two main parts. The first is his claim that doing F is an option for Sam if and only if Sam has the relevant kind of control over whether she does F. The second part is the claim that the relevant kind of control is what Portmore calls "rational." Together these two claims amount to what he calls "rationalism." Portmore situates the idea that something is an option for us if and only if we have control over whether or not we do it in a tradition that is at least as old as John Stuart Mill's suggestion that "Whenever we call something 'wrong' we mean to imply that a person ought to be punished somehow for doing it; if not by law, by the opinion of his fellow-creatures; if not by opinion, by the reproaches of his own conscience" (p. 93). Portmore follows recent interpreters[3] of Mill's claim as meaning, roughly, that the scope of one's obligations is what one can reasonably be held to account, absent an excusing condition.

Portmore's next step is to argue that we can reasonably be held accountable for doing or not doing something just in case we can exert control over whether or not we do the action, where the control in question is complete, over a span of time, personal, and rational. All four of these properties are worth discussion, but it is the last of them that will attract the most attention. By "rational control," Portmore means "whatever sort of control we exert directly over our reason-responsive attitudes by being both receptive and reactive to reasons" (p. 95). Crudely, reason-responsive attitudes are mental states that answer to reasons. Beliefs are paradigmatically reason-responsive. Avery's belief that her hat is on fire is responsive to her reasons for having this belief -- the smoke billowing from its brim, say. In contrast, feelings such as lethargy are not reason-responsive. Pat might remain listless and logy all day, even though she had plenty of rest.[4] As Portmore would have it, Sam has rational control over whether she writes a check to the Against Malaria Foundation or cures malaria just in case both of the following claims are true: First, Sam's rational capacities are properly sensitive to her relevant reasons, and second, she can exercise these capacities appropriately (p. 96). If Sam is like the rest of us, she meets both conditions with regard to writing a check but fails to so with respect to preventing all future cases of malaria.

It is hard not to feel the pull of Portmore's rationalism. One of its virtues is that it seems to make sense of widely-held intuitions about accountability such as: even though Pat did not intend to forget that she had to meet the deadline for submitting a book review, she did forget to do so and is, absent a suitable excuse, responsible for this omission. Portmore believes that rationalism gives us a credible story about why this and similar intuitions are correct. Pat has the capacity to be responsive to her reasons for action, including her reasons to believe that she has a deadline. However, in this case Pat "failed to exercise these capacities to good effect" (p. 98).

So far, so good, but I have a concern. What we wanted was an answer to the Option Question: What options are available to Sam? Portmore's answer to that question depends on whether or not Sam exercised her rational capacities appropriately. But whether or not she did so depends on whether exercising these capacities appropriately was an option for her. In other words, we are once again looking down the barrel of the Option Question. It would appear that we have just pushed the question of whether or not something was an option for Sam from one subject to another, and it's not obvious that this is progress.

Portmore next takes us to the Part/Whole Question. In Chapter 4, he makes his case that when determining what one ought to do, one's options should be limited to what he calls "maximal options." These are "options that are entailed only by evaluatively equivalent options such that each is no better or worse than the others" (p. 125). Imagine that Avery, who suffers from a broken hand, is sinking in quicksand. Pat can save Avery but every way in which she can do so will further damage Avery's broken hand. It might appear that Pat is in a normative bind: it is wrong to damage Avery's hand further, but it is right to save Avery from the quicksand, but saving Avery has as a proper part causing further damage to Avery's hand, which is wrong, etc. However, if Portmore is correct, then the only options that we should consider when determining what Pat ought to do are her maximal ones, in this case the various ways of saving Avery from death. Portmore refers to this view as "maximalism."

In Chapter 5, Portmore pulls back the curtain and shows the reader a wide variety of forms of maximalism, though it is immediately clear that he has a favorite. This favorite is rationalist maximalism, the conjunction of maximalism and rationalism, as defended in Chapters 2 and 3. Portmore argues that rationalist maximalism avoids the problems of some competing versions of maximalism, while at the same time providing plausible alternatives to other views about how one's future choices can influence what one ought to do now. And in Chapter 6 Portmore considers and responds to yet other reasons for skepticism about rationalist maximalism, focusing on the extent to which it is consistent with other independently plausible views regarding the nature of reasons. Much of the work of these chapters involves meticulous conceptual distinctions and the scrupulous consideration of the pros and cons of a wide array of subtly different hypotheses. Portmore excels at these tasks, and readers will learn a great deal from reasoning along with him, even if they are not convinced at every turn. Perhaps the most important service that Portmore performs in this sequence of chapters is to show the wide scope of the problems raised by the Part/Whole Question. Concerns about it were originally confined to forms of act consequentialism, and it has long been a source of worry in these quarters.[5] But Portmore shows quite clearly that these concerns arise for deontological competitors such as Rossian Pluralism.

We finally arrive in Chapter 7 at the final incline: the Assessment Question. Portmore argues for what he calls a "teleological" solution according to which we first determine the value of the prospects of our options in terms of what matters and then we determine the value of our options in terms of how their prospects compare to one another in terms of what matters. Teleology largely wins by default in Portmore's telling. He maintains that nonteleology runs into serious problems because of indeterminacy about whether or not an agent would violate an agent-based constraint by performing a given option, while teleology does not have this problem. But Portmore's conclusion needs context. Though teleology is usually contrasted with deontology,[6] Portmore's understanding of these terms is eccentric. On the one hand, teleology, as he thinks of it, is consistent with the idea that "something such as not violating agent-based constraints is what ultimately matters" (p. 232). On the other hand, deontology, in his view, is just the view that agent-based "constraints are ultimately grounded in our duty to respect people and their capacity for rational, autonomous decision making" (p. 258). Hence, the triumph of teleology does not come disguised as a resolution to hoary debates between Kantians, utilitarians, contractualists, etc. So even after climbing to these rarified heights, we cannot see the end of those controversies. Indeed, it is not even clear that nonteleology has really been vanquished. While Portmore prefers the view according to which ethics is never indeterminate, there is a long tradition[7] according to which it is a far less precise science, and I am not sure that adherents to this tradition would lose much sleep by conceding Portmore's point about indeterminacy.

Finally, in Chapter 8 Portmore synthesizes what he calls "rationalist teleological maximalism" and suggests some interesting directions in which we can expect him to go next. Since the chapter is short, forward-looking, and programmatic, I will not engage with it here.

While reading this book, I often thought of Derek Parfit's characterization of "Non-Religious Ethics" as being "at a very early state," and, as a result, "it is not irrational to have high hopes" for it.[8] Parfit might have added that in addition to being a young science, it is also an exceedingly difficult one. His own work was a reminder both of that fact and the fact that we might succeed even in the face of such difficulty. Portmore's work is similar to Parfit's with regard to both of these points. We have very far to travel if we are to vindicate Parfit's high hopes, but Opting for the Best might well be a milestone on that journey.


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[1] Let me note that, by "prospect," Portmore has in mind something a little more technical than the word's ordinary usage. In particular, Portmore means the probability distribution composed of all of the mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive possible worlds that could be made actual by an agent's action, subject to each possibility being given a probability, which obeys the Kalmagorov axioms (p. 3, n.4). But these technical details do not matter much for the purposes of this review so I largely ignore them and rely on the term's ordinary meaning.

[2] Compare Zimmerman (1994: 1-20).

[3] See, for example, Gibbard (1990: 36-54 and 126-152), Brandt (1992: 111-135), and Darwall (2006: 91-118).

[4] Compare the similar, if not quite identical, notion of judgment sensitive attitudes in Scanlon (1998: 20), Levy (2005), and Smith (2015).

[5] For example, CastaƱeda (1968) originally framed this as "a problem for utilitarianism," and Feldman (1986) responded from, roughly, that point of view.

[6] This way of dividing up the landscape goes back at least as far as Frankena (1963: 13) and was popularized by Rawls (1999: 22) among others.

[7] Aristotle (2014: 4) is the locus classicus for this point. But especially relevant in this context are Uyl (1992) and Tarsney (2018).

[8] Parfit (1984: 454).