Oughts and Thoughts: Scepticism and the Normativity of Meaning

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Anandi Hattiangadi, Oughts and Thoughts: Scepticism and the Normativity of Meaning, Oxford University Press, 2007, 221pp., $63.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199219025.

Reviewed by Reinaldo Elugardo, University of Oklahoma


This richly dense book defends Semantic Realism against Saul Kripke's meaning-skepticism argument. Hattiangadi contends that Semantic Realism must be true because the conclusion of Kripke's skeptical argument is radically incoherent.  The conclusion -- that no one ever means anything by any word she uses (Hattiangadi calls it, "the paradoxical conclusion" (3)) -- entails that Semantic Realism is false, and yet it can't entail anything unless it has content and truth-conditions, which means that a condition on its having any content at all is that Semantic Realism be true.  Hattiangadi also claims that Kripke's "divide and conquer" strategy is too weak to rule out a priori all possible meta-semantic theories -- it requires the premise that semantic meaning is normative.  (I will have something to say about Hattiangadi's last claim at the end of this review.)  Other central theses of the book are:

[1]  Semantic Realism doesn't entail Semantic Normativity, at least not in its strongest version needed to generate the Paradoxical Conclusion.

[2]  Semantic Normativity is false.

Hattiangadi concludes her book on a cautious but optimistic note (209-211).  On the one hand, we can be assured that Semantic Realism is true.  On the other hand, no extant meta-semantic theory has succeeded in specifying the relevant objective facts that determine meaning (Chapters 5 and 6), and it is unlikely that any of them will for reasons that Kripke gives in Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language.  Still, given Semantic Realism, we know that there must be some such fact even if we are never in a position to access it.  Hence, we are better off than we were before we read Kripke's book -- in fact, we always were if Hattiangadi is right.

I cannot discuss all the issues covered in the book.  Instead, I will focus on three topics that form its core: Semantic Realism, Semantic Normativity, and Hattiangadi's arguments against Semantic Normativity.  I will summarize her main points on each and offer some comments along the way.

What is Semantic Realism?

Hattiangadi defines Semantic Realism thus (12-13):

(i)  "What someone means or understands by a word (mental representation) can be given by the correctness conditions of the word (mental representation) as it is understood."

(ii)  "What someone means or understands by a sentence (mental representation) can be given by the truth conditions of the sentence (mental representation) as it is understood."

(iii)  "Ascriptions of meaning to linguistic utterances and mental states are 'factual', that is, they can either be true or false, and when true, are true in virtue of objective (i.e., judgment independent) facts."

By the "correctness conditions" of a word, Hattiangadi means a set of conditions that are both necessary and sufficient for the word to be true of or to refer to its extension or its bearer.  In English, we can represent the correctness conditions of a word disquotationally, as in:

[3]  For any object x, 'table' correctly applies to x if and only if x is a table.

A more robust and essentialist characterization of the correctness conditions of 'table' would include a set of features (if any) that all and only tables must have in order to be tables.

Now according to (i) of Semantic Realism, a word's correctness conditions (if it has any) can specify what a speaker means by it.  Hattiangadi formulates this idea as [4]:

[4]  Norm-Relativity: "S means F by x → (a)(S applies 'correctly' x to aa is F)" (56)

Thus, for example, a condition on Maria's meaning table by 'table' is that her application of 'table' to any arbitrary object be correct just in case the object in question is a table.  As Hattiangadi points out, 'correct' occurs in [4] in its non-evaluative descriptive sense.  Maria is not required to apply 'table' to anything or do anything.  Consequently, nothing prescriptive follows from the fact that Semantic Realism says that a person's meaning something by a word can be given by its correctness conditions.

What is Semantic Normativity?

Hattiangadi defines the notion of semantic normativity as [5]:

[5]  Normativity: "S means F by x → (a)((S ought to (apply x to a)) ↔ a is F))" (56)

Suppose that Maria means table by 'table'.  Then, according to Normativity, meaning table in that way underwrites a semantic obligation she incurred as a consequence, namely, an obligation to apply 'table' to all and only tables.  It is something that Maria should do independently of any prudential, legal, or moral reasons she might have for doing so.  The 'ought' in [5], then, is to be taken in its categorical prescriptive sense rather than in its instrumental sense (183).  Presumably, a competent and rational speaker who reflectively judges that she ought to apply a word to all and only things that are in its extension, irrespective of her inclinations and communicative goals, would (ipso facto) be motivated to do so for just that reason alone.  That view is known as "Motivational Internalism", according to which no conceptual gap exists between one's normative judgments and one's motivation or will: one's motives to act independently of one's desires, feelings, and goals constitute one's normative judgments (41-43).

We are now in a position to pave the way for Kripke's skeptical argument (Chapter 3).  Suppose that Normativity and Motivational Internalism hold.  Then, any natural fact that constitutes, say,  Maria's meaning will metaphysically guarantee her being moved to apply 'table' to all and only tables if she were to judge that she should, irrespective of her desires.  Let F, then, be any possible natural fact whatsoever.  If Kripke is right, no such fact could guarantee that Maria will be so moved, and thus, no such fact could determine what she ought to do qua competent speaker with respect to her use of 'table'.  After all, her past, present, and future applications of 'table' (including counterfactual ones) may be in accord with different, non-standard, semantic interpretations that include both tables and non-tables in their distinct extensions.  For all we know, she may be moved to apply 'table' differently.  Now whether Maria would be making a semantic mistake in those cases or whether she would be going on in the same way as before cannot be settled by any or all the natural facts there are or that could be (Chapter 5).  The reason is that these alternative interpretations of 'table' are compatible with F.  And so, F couldn't be a meaning-constitutive fact.  (A version of the same argument can be used to exclude, a priori, any possible irreducibly non-natural fact (Chapter 6).)  Therefore, there is no such thing as a meaning-constituting fact, and that means that no possible meta-semantic theory could be true.  It also means that our meaning-ascriptions lack truth-conditions, contrary to what (iii) of Semantic Realism says.  Hence, Semantic Realism is false.

Given that Hattiangadi accepts Semantic Realism, she will reject the above argument on the grounds that it involves a false premise: Normativity.  (Note: Hattiangadi doesn't criticize Motivational Internalism because doing so would have been beyond the scope of the book -- but she does have her doubts about the view (43).)  I will now turn to her objections.

Hattiangadi's Argument Against Normativity

Hattiangadi presents three different arguments against Normativity in Chapter 1, Chapter 3, and Chapter 7.  The first two can be met, but the third is unassailable.  However, as I will later argue, there is another way of interpreting the notion of semantic normativity that isn't open to her criticisms.

Hattiangadi's first argument is that Normativity is too strong because it entails [6] (180):

[6]  S means F by x → (a)(a is FS ought to (apply x to a))

[6] implies that, e.g., if I mean green by 'green' then I ought to apply 'green' to every green thing there is. But since I can't do that and since ought implies can, it follows that I don't have such an obligation.  The fact that I lack the obligation to apply 'green' to every green thing would in turn imply (given [6]) that, since there are green things, I don't mean green by 'green', which is absurd.  Of course, the meaning-skeptic would regard that as an acceptable consequence.  So, Hattiangadi's first argument is inconclusive given that the Semantic Realist and the meaning-skeptic will have conflicting intuitions about this particular example.

Hattiangadi's second argument is that Normativity also entails something weaker but no less implausible, namely, [7]:

[7]  Normativity*: "S means F by x → (a)((S ought to (apply x to a)) → a is F)" (57)

She gives two reasons for rejecting Normativity* (186-188).  First, a speaker can mis-apply a word and not be violating any semantic obligation.  For example, the speaker may be lying, speaking sarcastically, or speaking ironically.  Hattiangadi gives the example of a speaker, Matilda, who tells a lie when she says, 'My house is on fire'.  According to Hattiangadi, Matilda does mean is on fire by 'is on fire', even though she applies it to something that isn't on fire.  Presumably, if Matilda wants to lie rather than tell the truth, then she ought to apply 'is on fire' to her house -- but for all that, she still means is on fire by 'is on fire'.  Hence, Normativity* is false.  Second, a speaker can fail to apply a word to things that are in its extension for quite trivial reasons, e.g., she may have other better things to do or it may not have crossed her mind to apply the word correctly.  In either case, the speaker isn't making a semantic mistake.  Failure to use a word in accord with its correctness conditions, argues Hattiangadi, is not in all cases a violation of some semantic obligation.

Hattiangadi's second argument can also be met.  First, cases in which speakers are using words non-literally, as they do when they speak sarcastically or ironically, are irrelevant to the issue at hand.  Normativity* constrains what a speaker may do if she is to literally mean what her words mean.  As for the Matilda Example, if one knows that an object isn't F, then (by [7]) one isn't semantically obligated to apply an expression that means F to that object since it won't be F.  Matilda is therefore under no obligation to apply 'is on fire' (as opposed to any other expression) to her house even though she wants to deceive her addressee.  From the point of view of semantics, she is permitted to use another expression that isn't true of her house.  As for the case where a speaker simply forgets to apply a word to some object for which she is allegedly obligated to do: according to [7], the speaker violated a semantic obligation to use the right word, especially if she could have remembered, could have used the right word, and should have.  This admission, as counterintuitive as it may sound, does not show that [7] is false.  If anything, it shows only that [7] is vacuously true in those cases.

Hattiangadi's third argument is that no rule can simultaneously prescribe categorically what a speaker ought to do or judge and, at the same time, specify the correctness conditions of the speaker's words (201-202).  Consider, once again, Maria and the rule that gives the correctness conditions of 'table':

[8]  Rule R: (a)('table' applies to aa is a table)

R specifies infinitely many possible applications of 'table' insofar as 'a' ranges over an infinite domain of objects (tables, chairs, dogs, numbers, etc.).  Suppose that R is also a rule that categorically prescribes what any speaker, S, who means table by 'table', must do.  R then also has the features of R*:

[9]  Rule R*: (a)(S ought to (apply 'table' to a ) ↔ a is a table)

However, Maria is not obligated to apply 'table' to all (possible) tables since no one can apply the word to every table that there is.  Once again, given that ought implies can, Maria incurs no such obligation.  Moreover, as Hattiangadi points out, even if Maria were semantically obligated to apply 'table' only to tables, that wouldn't constitute its meaning.  Being obligated to apply 'table' only to tables does not entail that 'table' applies to all tables, which is an essential part of the correctness conditions of 'table'.  R and R* therefore pull in opposite directions, as Hattiangadi so nicely puts it.  Thus, the idea that semantic meaning is normative in the categorical prescriptive sense and at the same time determines a word's correctness conditions is incoherent.

I'm persuaded by Hattiangadi's last argument.  However, here is an alternative understanding of semantic normativity that avoids her three objections and that might do the job that Kripke needs for his skeptical argument to work:

[10]  Normativity**: S means F by x → (S ought to bring it about that: ((a)(S apply x to a) → a is F))

The difference between Normativity* and Normativity** is that 'ought' has narrow-scope in the former and wide-scope in the latter.  Now Hattiangadi does consider [10] but then rejects it for the following reason:

On the wide scope interpretation, all that follows is that you ought to avoid combining applying 'green' to a with a's being non-green.  This principle, together with the fact that a is non-green, does not imply that you ought to refrain from applying 'green' to x.  This does not, I think, capture the original intuition.  (58 fn.)

Hattiangadi is right, but her point also holds for the narrow-scope reading.  Normativity*, "together with the fact that a is non-green, does not imply that you ought to refrain from applying 'green' to x" either.  What follows instead is that, in the case where a is non-green, either you don't mean green by 'green' or you aren't obligated to apply 'green' to a, which is different from saying that you are obligated "to refrain from applying 'green'" to a.  So, Normativity* doesn't have an advantage over Normativity** on that score.

More importantly, Normativity** does "capture the original intuition" that Kripke's skeptic has in mind.  Suppose you mean green by 'green' and that it is transparent to you that you do.  Recognition of that is a sufficient reason for you to align your semantic intentions and linguistic behavior in accordance with your judgment.  If we assume Motivational Internalism, then you will be moved to self-impose a rule according to which you apply a word to an object only if that object is in the word's extension.  Your being so motivated is not contingent on your desires but on your semantic competence and on your recognition that part of what it means to be semantically competent is to be so motivated.  It is a semantic obligation you incur qua semantically competent speaker of the language although it cannot, as Hattiangadi has argued, fix the correctness conditions of any word -- at best, it presupposes them.

Still, the skeptic will argue that no natural fact could entail that you are moved to act in just that way irrespective of your desires.  In which case, given Motivational Internalism, no natural fact can entail the normative claim that you ought to bring about a state of affairs in which you apply words in accordance with their correctness conditions.  And thus, no such fact could be meaning-constituting given Normativity**.  This is a possible line of argument that Hattiangadi hasn't blocked.

Are We Really Better Off Now?

I will close with a general observation.  Let's grant that meaning can't be normative in any strong sense, that Semantic Realism must true and, thus, that meaning-constituting facts exist, even though no current meta-semantic theory has succeeded in specifying them.  Unfortunately, even without Normativity, we are in a worse situation than before.  Here's why.  On the one hand, we can't deny, on pain of inconsistency, that meaning-constituting facts exist.  On the other hand, it is a mystery as to how there could be such facts if Hattiangadi's arguments in Chapters 5 and 6 succeed.  Her arguments therein provide a blueprint for ruling out, a priori, all possible meaning-constituting facts, and with them, all possible meta-semantic theories.  In other words, let's grant that Hattiangadi has refuted all the specific reductionist and anti-reductionist theories that she discusses in her book.  One would think that a generalized version of her arguments should work just as well, one that applies to all possible speakers, words, meanings, facts (natural or non-natural), and meta-semantic theories (no matter what form they take).  All that is needed is Hattiangadi's premise that, if a fact that purports to constitute our meanings cannot screen out all possible semantic indeterminacies, then it cannot be a meaning-constituting fact.  A natural understanding of Kripke's skeptical argument is that any possible natural fact and any possible sui generis fact will always be susceptible to this kind of failure.  In which case, we have no choice but to conclude, a priori, and without the use of Normativity, that no meaning-constituting fact is possible, which Hattiangadi says is incoherent if true.  Something has to give.

Despite my reservations, Oughts and Thoughts is an excellent addition to the growing literature on meaning-skepticism.  Hattiangadi has done a magnificent job of covering so much philosophical territory with great insight and care for details -- from Kripke's skeptical argument and "skeptical solution", G.E. Moore's Open Question Argument and the Naturalistic Fallacy, to Dispositional accounts of content and Robert Brandom's Neo-Pragmaticism.  There is so much that one can learn from Hattiangadi's book and she is to be commended for having written it.