Our Own Minds: Sociocultural Grounds for Self-Consciousness

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Radu J. Bogdan, Our Own Minds: Sociocultural Grounds for Self-Consciousness, MIT Press, 2010, 210pp., $32.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262026376.

Reviewed by Joel Smith, University of Manchester


Our Own Minds presents an account of the nature and development of self-consciousness. Bogdan describes the mind of the infant as outward looking, turning in on itself only at a relatively late stage of development. This it does as a response to the increasingly sophisticated sociocultural pressures it faces throughout infancy and early childhood. The book is difficult to follow (about which, more later) but the main line of argument is this: to begin with, infants are attuned to their physical and sociocultural environment, employing an early form of intuitive psychology, a practical capacity to interact with conspecifics, referred to by Bogdan as 'naïve psychology' (129). However, infants are faced with a series of sociocultural tasks (109-12), the implementation of which requires them to develop various executive capacities (105-9) which 'install' a form of self-consciousness, dubbed by Bogdan 'extrovert self-consciousness' (99-100). The increasingly demanding nature of these sociocultural tasks has the consequence that, around the age of 4, intuitive psychology undergoes a shift, becoming 'commonsense psychology' (129-30). This enables children to represent others' propositional attitudes and to think 'offline' (129-30). These new abilities and associated executive capacities, in their turn, 'install' a new form of self-consciousness, 'introvert self-consciousness' (159). Whilst the child's intuitive psychology and self-consciousness continue to develop until adolescence (33), this is where the book's central argument ends.

Bogdan brings together a number of interesting issues, has a fascinating story to tell, and offers some provocative claims, but the main line of argument is not well defended. I begin with some general problems with the book and then focus on a few specific themes.

I have mentioned that the book is difficult to follow. This is, in large part, due to a lack of clarity concerning some of Bogdan's central concepts.

First, Bogdan has a tendency to introduce novel terminology, often metaphorical, without sufficient explanation. For example, we are told that it is the job of 'intuitive psychology to recruit and assemble' various executive abilities (12); that we can possess a 'concept driven representation' (40) or an 'experience driven category' (41); that the key features of self-consciousness 'reflect executive abilities' (80); that self-thoughts 'sponsor self-ascriptions of attitudes' (145); and that thoughts are ordinarily 'anchored at and by oneself' (151) [my emphases]. But without further explanation the meaning of these terms is unclear.

Second, Bogdan's key claims are often given apparently contrasting formulations. For example, within the space of three pages Bogdan tells us that the joint exercise of certain executive abilities 'is conducive to the development of extrovert self-consciousness' (109); that these executive abilities are 'consciousness-generating'; finally that these abilities are 'potential marks of extrovert self-consciousness' (111) [my emphases]. Given that these claims appear non-equivalent, the intended strength of one of Bogdan's central claims is unclear.

Another general problem with the book is the fact that the arguments for a number of crucial claims are unconvincing or, in some cases, impossible to locate. I offer two representative examples.

First, Bogdan presents a number of arguments against simulationism, one of which is that 'Young children's minds do not operate fully offline and therefore cannot engage in [the] genuine imaginative pretense' (57) that simulation requires. But this ignores the fact that Alvin Goldman, perhaps the most prominent defender of simulationism and discussed by Bogdan in chapter three, proposes a 'low-level' form of simulation that, crucially, does not involve imaginative pretence (Goldman 2006: Ch. 6).

Second, Bogdan argues against the conceivability of zombies as follows:

If self-consciousness [which Bogdan takes not to entail phenomenal consciousness] emerges out of self-regulation by means of executive abilities, then, as executive duplicates of ours, zombies must by definition be self-conscious. But if they are functionally self-conscious and are also biochemical duplicates of ours, then zombies ought to be phenomenally conscious as well. (173)

This begs the question against those who take zombies to be conceivable, assuming, without argument, that having the right biochemistry plus functional organisation is sufficient for phenomenal consciousness.

I don't doubt that many of Bogdan's claims are defensible, my point is merely that they are not well defended here. So much for general complaints. I want now to focus on some of Bogdan's core themes: self-consciousness, 'target-relatedness', and blindsight.

The book's subtitle suggests that Bogdan is concerned with an account of the development of self-consciousness. And so he is. It is surprising, then, to find that from the very beginning of the book Bogdan seems to be offering an account, not just of self-consciousness, but of consciousness itself. For instance, he tells us that he aims to show that 'the regulation of self-to-target relatedness renders the self's sense of that relatedness and of its affordances conscious' (9). This becomes less puzzling when we see that Bogdan takes consciousness to entail self-consciousness (74) (although, oddly, Bogdan later takes this back (193)).

So what, according to Bogdan, is self-consciousness? Importantly, Bogdan is not concerned with phenomenal (self-)consciousness but with 'functional' (self-)consciousness (x-xi). Roughly, the idea is that, functionally speaking, self-consciousness is defined by certain 'parameters' that reflect a range of executive abilities. These abilities include, amongst other things, acting with intent (105), attending to one's attitudes (106), and engaging in 'active intermodal cooperation' (107). Thus, claims Bogdan, showing the presence of just these parameters, reflecting just these abilities, 'confirms the presence and exercise' (159) of self-consciousness.

Bogdan distinguishes between extrovert and introvert self-consciousness. First there is 'extrovert self-consciousness'. This is 'consciousness not only of the world children [and adults] face but also of their relatedness to that world' (16) or, for the case of seeing an apple, 'consciousness of seeing, or being visually related to, the apple' (73). This is distinguished from 'introvert self-consciousness', which is a subject's consciousness 'of their own thoughts as they relate to their targets' (16), again, 'not just consciousness of a thought but consciousness of being related to what the thought is about' (73).

But this distinction is perplexing. In both extrovert and introvert self-consciousness, I am conscious of some state of mine (seeing, thinking) and conscious of that state's relating me to some object, viz. the thing seen or thought about. Neither one seems more 'inner' than the other, as one might expect from the 'extrovert' and 'introvert' terminology. In both cases, it seems, I self-ascribe something: a visual state in the case of extrovert self-consciousness and a thought in the case of introvert self-consciousness. So, the distinction seems to be a matter, not of the presence or absence of self-ascription, but of the type of state self-ascribed. This interpretation seems to fit well with Bogdan's definition of 'self-thoughts', supposedly a novelty of the turn to commonsense psychology and introvert self-consciousness, as 'self-ascriptive thought[s] whose content contains an explicitly contained thought or attitude' (154), a definition that explicitly rules out the self-ascription of sensory states.

However, this may not be the whole story. Bogdan tends, when outlining introvert self-consciousness, to give examples of third-order, rather than merely second-order, representations. For example, Bogdan writes that understanding one's own thoughts,

is a reflexive enterprise, in the sense that one turns one's mind explicitly toward one's own thoughts and attitudes … An example of the exercise of the ETE [explicit thought embedding] ability is to form the following thoughts: "I think that what I wanted to say is that very few dogs bark for a good reason" (140).

On the one hand, Bogdan's talk of reflexivity suggests that he is simply concerned with the capacity to self-ascribe thoughts (he later says that, 'self-thoughts are mental structures that enable self-ascriptions of attitudes' (145)). On the other hand, Bogdan's example is of the self-ascription of a self-ascription of a desire (also, see the example on (120)). So, it may be that, in addition to the move from sensory and other states to thoughts and attitudes, the move from extrovert to introvert self-consciousness also involves the move from self-ascriptions to self-ascriptions of self-ascriptions. Ultimately, however, I remain unsure what the distinction between extrovert and introvert self-consciousness really amounts to.

I turn now to another of Bogdan's central notions: target-relatedness. Bogdan tells us that 'target-relatedness' is simply another term for intentionality (75). However, Bogdan's employment of the term is baffling, and this is serious considering that the book's central concept, self-consciousness, is defined in terms of it. Consider Bogdan's discussion of the 'experiential fallacy', the idea that 'the experience of one's own attitudes delivers a metarepresentation of their target-relatedness' (37-8), to which he claims both theory theory and simulationism are committed. This is a 'fallacy', since the 'target relatedness of one's own attitudes' is something that 'introspective information cannot reveal, not by itself' (59). In a similar vein, Bogdan argues that the 'self-monitoring mechanism' posited by Shaun Nichols and Stephen Stich can reveal, 'the attitude type (e.g., belief) and the content (what is believed)' but that, 'These two experiential parameters … need not reveal the relation between the representation involved and its target' (61).

This is puzzling. On the face of it, a state's target-relatedness is the fact that it is target-related. But this is, quite plausibly, given by its type (e.g., if I am aware of something as a desire, then I am aware of it as something that is target-related). So this can't be what Bogdan has in mind. Perhaps, then, Bogdan's claim is that introspection cannot reveal the content of one's states. This might be motivated on the grounds that a state's intentionality just is its representational content, not an uncommon view. However, his discussion of Nichols and Stich suggests that this is not the case. Perhaps, then, the idea is that introspection does not reveal the target (or, intentional object) of the state. But this seems implausible since if we are aware of a state's content we are surely aware of which object it targets (albeit, perhaps, under some mode of presentation). Thus, it is not clear what target-relatedness can be, such that it is invisible to introspection.

Perhaps we can make sense of Bogdan's concept by offering a different reading of his apparent acceptance of the claim that introspection reveals a state's type and content. For I have been tacitly assuming that this means that introspection reveals that a state of a particular type has a particular content. But perhaps Bogdan means that, when one introspects the belief that P, one becomes aware that one has a belief and that P, but not that one believes that P. If so, introspection would not reveal a state's target-relatedness, in the sense of its having a particular content.

It is, however, rather implausible to maintain that introspection could reveal a belief without revealing its content, and, as such, the claim requires a much more robust defence. Second, it is clearly not what Nichols and Stich have in mind ('[the] Monitoring Mechanism … takes the representation P in the Belief Box and produces the representation I believe that P as output' (Nichols & Stich 2003: 160-1)), and so the criticism that 'Nichols and Stich's proposal does not directly address the crucial question' (61) would rest on a misrepresentation of their view.

I turn, finally, to blindsight, which plays a crucial role in Bogdan's story, linking his suite of executive abilities to (self-)consciousness. The claim is that blindsighters lack the executive abilities mentioned above and that this lack is (partly) responsible for their lack of consciousness (3). Let us accept this claim for now. Bogdan goes on to suggest a parallel between blindsighters and animals, taking, 'blindsight to suggest the strong possibility that consciousness may be absent in many if not most animal minds.' (4) Since most animals operate, 'without the assistance of the various executive abilities that are absent in blindsight', Bogdan aligns 'The successful yet unconscious perceptuomotor cognition and action of both blindsighters (in the blind field) and (possibly) most animal species' (4). This may well be challenged. For one thing, most animal species seem to possess a number of the executive abilities mentioned. For example, it certainly appears that most animals are able to monitor and control their sensory states and can share information between modalities. But let us also grant Bogdan this (he says more about animals' abilities later in the book (e.g., 112-4)). For especially salient are not the similarities between blindsighters and animals, but the differences between them. Animal species are manifestly able to navigate their environments without prompting. But this is precisely what blindsighters cannot do. On Bogdan's own understanding, in order to navigate their environments, blindsighters need to be prompted (100). Thus, the generalisation from blindsighters to animals (102) and, potentially, infants (49) seems hasty. Bogdan needs something more like the fictional 'super-blindsighters' (Block 1995), who need no prompting (actually, there is some recent support for the existence of super-blindsighters, see for example Huxlin et al. 2009).

Returning to Bogdan's claim that the lack of executive abilities in blindsighters is responsible for their lack of visual consciousness, let us grant that Bogdan has shown a correlation between these abilities and (self-)consciousness. Has he shown that the former is responsible for the latter? In particular, has he ruled out that the explanation goes the other way­ -- that the lack of consciousness explains why blindsighters lack various executive abilities? Bogdan recognises the need for such an argument, writing, 'To get it as close as possible to nonaccidental link and perhaps to causation, the rest of the book aims to tighten and constrain from various angles the correlation between executive abilities and self-consciousness' (6). However, it is at this point that I fail to find an argument. Bogdan has argued that executive abilities are correlated with self-consciousness, and he does argue (albeit in another context) that we are not forced to see self-consciousness as the prior, explanatory, phenomenon (70-2), but as far as I can tell, he doesn't show that there is a causal relation here nor what the direction of causation might be.

There is a great deal in this enormously rich book that I have not dealt with. I have focused on those aspects that I found wanting and, whilst my overall assessment is largely negative, the book does offer an intriguing account of self-consciousness and its development as a response to sociocultural pressures. A final caveat: I come to Bogdan's book largely ignorant of his previous work. Bogdan often references his previous books and it is entirely possible that the answers to some of the complaints that I have aired are to be found in that large body of work.


Block, N. 1995. On a confusion about the function of consciousness. Behavioral and Brain Sciences 18: 227-47.

Goldman, A. I. 2006. Simulating Minds: The philosophy, psychology, and neuroscience of mindreading. New York: Oxford University Press.

Huxlin, K. R. et al. 2009. Perceptual Relearning of Complex Visual Motion after V1 Damage in Humans. Journal of Neuroscience, 29: 3981-91.

Nichols, S. & Stich, S. P. 2003. Mindreading: An integrated account of pretence, self-awareness, and understanding other minds. New York: Oxford University Press.