Out from the Shadows: Analytical Feminist Contributions to Traditional Philosophy

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Sharon L. Crasnow and Anita M. Superson (eds.), Out from the Shadows: Analytical Feminist Contributions to Traditional Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2012, 545pp., $41.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199855476.


Reviewed by Samantha Brennan, University of Western Ontario


In its early days, the force of feminist philosophy was its powerful criticisms of the philosophical canon and of recent work in mainstream philosophy. Today feminist philosophy has moved past criticism to making positive contributions to philosophy across a wide range of areas. This volume aims to show that this is so in the case of analytic philosophy.

Sharon Crasnow and Anita Superson envision their volume marking a new stage in the conversation between analytic philosophy and feminism. Featuring the work of eighteen analytical feminists, this collection highlights contributions feminists have made to problems central to analytic philosophy. If this is correct, mainstream analytic philosophy that doesn't include feminist work is missing out and is dangerously shallow and limited in scope.

That's a very strong thesis, and this volume doesn't have to argue for that thesis directly. Instead, the volume itself is an indirect argument for the claim. It shows readers the wide range of contributions feminism has made to analytic philosophy and poses the important question, why does mainstream analytic philosophy continue to ignore the contributions feminism has made? In describing their motivation for the volume in the introduction, the editors note that feminist work still has a hard time finding acceptance in the mainstream journals in analytic philosophy. When you combine this with the tendency of some feminist philosophers to reject the methods of analytic philosophy, feminist analytic philosophy needs its own venue.

I think the challenges and questions posed here are particularly important at a time when it seems like philosophy risks becoming stagnant. It can feel at times like we're a dying discipline. And yet, this volume shows feminist philosophers engaged with the world and with important social questions about oppression, justice, and progress. The sheer size of the volume gives some indication of how much feminist philosophy has to say to the tradition. There is also incredible breadth in this volume. Papers range in topic from ethics and political philosophy to epistemology, philosophy of science, and philosophy of language.

There isn't one consistent message (and who would expect that really?), but Jennifer Saul's paper touches on a theme many of the papers share. It's the lesson we learn from the particular subfield of philosophy when we pose questions that matter to feminist analysis. In the end, it's not just relevant for feminist work. Saul writes about her efforts at extending analysis in philosophy of language to terms that matter to her politically, such as 'man' and 'woman'. (Also, 'race', 'sex', 'gender', 'gay', 'straight', etc.) Philosophers writing about kinds have tended to focus terms that don't have an obvious political element, such as 'pain' or 'water'. Some work in philosophy of language did prove useful in thinking about the politically significant terms, but new puzzles also arose, writes Saul, and "newer puzzles bring with them challenging new methodological issues. And that, once raised, these methodological issues are not confined to the politically significant puzzles. Some of them, at least, are issues that every traditional philosopher of language would do well to consider." (195)

Another stand out contribution is the essay with which the volume begins, Ann Cudd's "Resistance is (Not) Futile." Cudd describes political philosophy as the "ground zero" of feminist influence in philosophy. Cudd assesses recent feminist contributions to political philosophy focusing on the sex/gender distinction, the public/private distinction, the nature of autonomy, and the structure of oppression. Cudd also addresses head-on the political challenges facing feminists in philosophy. She describes the epistemological advantages of working in the margins of political philosophy and the potential costs of mainstreaming. In the end, though, Cudd thinks the inclusion of feminist work in political philosophy is inevitable. She applauds the progress our discipline has made. As evidence, she cites the number of entries in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy on feminist topics (39), the hiring of people who work in feminist philosophy in top philosophy departments, the number of women, many of whom are feminists, as heads of our scholarly associations, and the books in feminist philosophy being published by top academic publishers. I don't quite share Cudd's optimism, but if I were to select just a few essays for graduate students to introduce them to feminist work in political philosophy, Cudd's essay would be among them.

Helga Varden continues her project of feminist Kantianism in the chapter "A Feminist, Kantian Conception of the Right to Bodily Integrity: The Cases of Abortion and Homosexuality." Varden argues that Kant's account of the right to bodily integrity is the best route for grounding rights to same sex relationships and the right to abortion. On Kant's account, the just state must be reconcilable with each person's right to freedom. Varden isn't interested in sexual relationships and pregnancy from the point of view of religion or ethics. Instead, she's interested more narrowly in what the just state can say about abortion and sex. The understanding of Kant's political theory in terms of embodiment is original and offers feminists new reasons to care about Kantian approaches to political philosophy, but I found myself wishing that Varden engaged more directly with other feminist philosophers on these topics. How does Varden's Kantian analysis connect to other feminist work on abortion, for example?

In her essay "The Analytic Tradition, Radical (Feminist) Interpretation, and the Hygiene Hypothesis," Sharyn Clough looks at differing standards for cleanliness for girls, especially under the age of 5. Much more so than boys, girls are encouraged to play indoors, wear clothes that can't get dirty, and wear clothes that restrict their movement. Even in 1998, studies showed that 1/3 of 5-year-old girls regularly wore dresses, and even though some of the dresses might be worn with leggings, girls still moved differently while wearing them. This seems like an innocent enough social fact; but if the hygiene hypothesis is correct, keeping little girls clean also has a profound (and negative) effect on their health.

Mariam Thalos' chapter pushes the boundaries of analytic philosophy itself. She offers an existentialist and naturalist account of social identity that draws on themes from the work of Simone de Beauvoir. Thalos is interested in the collective aspect of experience that's central to much writing about gender and race. She argues for an account of the social construction of identity and explores the range of kinds of group identities and the importance of them. A wide ranging essay, drawing on such diverse sources as Sartre, E. O. Wilson, and Freud, Thalos' chapter makes it clear that feminist work needn't be intellectually narrow and that the big questions that interest feminists are connected to long standing themes in the history of philosophy.

The volume closes with Ann Garry's essay, "Who Is Included? Intersectionality, Metaphors, and the Multiplicity of Gender," which calls out for feminist philosophy to be more inclusive and pluralistic. It's a nice note on which to end the volume since feminist philosophy in the analytic tradition has not been able to move past all of the limitations found in analytic philosophy. Feminists have made an improvement, but things are far from perfect. Garry's essay is an important acknowledgment of the work that remains to be done, particularly with regard to race. In order to move white women from center stage, Garry writes that feminist philosophers must pay more attention to the lives of women of colour, learn about how various forms of oppression intermesh, and learn how our practices contribute to the ongoing exclusion of women of colour. Garry presents and argues for a broad conception of intersectionality which she thinks best addresses the needs of feminist philosophy. Garry expands on Kimberlé Crenshaw's well-known traffic flow model of intersectionality to include topographical details such as mountains. She goes on to replace the vehicles moving through the model with liquids so we can better grasp how identities and group memberships flow and combine. It's a rich picture at the center of an excellent chapter.

While I haven't reviewed every essay in the volume, I hope this gives potential readers some idea of the richness and scope of this project and of analytic feminist philosophy generally. Not all of the essays address the meta-question of the relationship between feminist analytic philosophy and the philosophical mainstream, but enough of them do, so it's instructive reading this volume if that question is of interest. A number of contributors thank Crasnow and Superson for their dedication to the project, their extensive comments and engagement with the material, and for their belief in the worth of analytic feminist philosophy as a subfield of philosophy. It's worth noting that only one of the essays was previously published. While this certainly makes the volume original, and for that reason alone worth acquiring, the result is a little uneven in terms of overall quality. The volume would make an excellent teaching tool for a graduate or upper-level undergraduate seminar in feminist analytic philosophy. I've also suggested it to colleagues who teach mainstream metaphysics, philosophy of science, epistemology, philosophy of language and meta-ethics when they've enquired about contemporary work by women authors to include in their courses.