Out of the Cave: A Philosophical Inquiry into the Dead Sea Scrolls Research

Placeholder book cover

Edna Ullmann-Margalit, Out of the Cave: A Philosophical Inquiry into the Dead Sea Scrolls Research, Harvard University Press, 2006, 167pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0674022238.

Reviewed by Aviezer Tucker, Queens University Belfast


The philosophies of archaeology and historiography (representations of the past-history) examine general themes in epistemology, philosophy of science, metaphysics and value theory in the particular context of beliefs about the past that are founded on rigorous analysis of textual and material evidence. They raise questions about the status of the knowledge of the past that historiography and archaeology produce, the relationships between historiographic and archaeological hypotheses and evidence, objectivity and subjectivity, explanation and understanding, value judgements and neutrality, and the ontology of the objects of historiography and archaeology.

The best methodology for the philosophies of historiography and archaeology may well emulate the integration of the philosophy of science with its historiography and sociology. Answers to some philosophic-epistemic questions can be discovered in the historically evolving practices of the communities of historians and archaeologists. As in the philosophy of science, the examination of controversies may teach us much about the dynamics of research in disciplinary communities, norms of theory replacement revision and choice, and the interplay between internal and external influences on theory formation and acceptance. Philosophical case studies of episodes from the history of science are more numerous than of episodes from the history of historiography and archaeology. But there are interesting philosophical case studies, not just of famous episodes in the history of natural history, but also of controversies in human historiography and archaeology, e.g. in the writings of philosophers like William Dray, Peter Kosso, and Alison Wylie, or in articles in journals like History and Theory.

Edna Ullmann-Margalit's choice of studying controversies over the Dead Sea scrolls to flesh out issues in the philosophies of archaeology and historiography is excellent. The discovery of the Dead Sea scrolls in the middle of the 20th century, arguably the most significant discovery in the history of archaeology, is eminently useful for the examination of the effects of sudden, surprising, new evidence on established beliefs about the past and the process by which some hypotheses become established in a community while others are rejected or remain underdetermined. The controversies over the explanation of this treasure trove of evidence can be useful for understanding the dynamics of theory acceptance and revision in the communities of archaeologists and historians, and the effects of internal and external (mostly religious in this case) factors. This has been recognized at least since Leon Goldstein's Historical Knowing (1976) where a case study of controversies over the Dead Sea scrolls was used to support a Constructionist, anti-realist, philosophy of historiography.

I am not qualified to judge the quality of descriptions of archaeological research in Out of the Cave. Philosophically, Ullmann-Margalit poses lucidly the philosophically relevant questions about the relations between evidence and theory in archaeology, external vs. internal reasons for theory revision, objectivity, and the extent to which archaeology can offer a determined knowledge of the past. The book also offers occasional glimpses of promising approaches to solving these problems. However, the overall philosophical quality of the answers offered is quite limited because this study seems to have evolved in a philosophic vacuum. The book does not refer to a single work in the philosophies of historiography or archaeology, let alone to comparable case studies, not even to Goldstein's philosophical study of research on the Dead Sea scrolls that was written in Ullmann-Margalit's home institution, the Hebrew University, while Goldstein held a fellowship there. There are a few references to works in the philosophy of science, but almost none to works in contemporary epistemology and philosophy of science. Writing philosophy without doing homework, familiarising oneself with the relevant philosophical literature, leads inevitably to serious drawbacks: Being forced to "reinvent the wheel" instead of building on the advanced research of others limits the range of innovative new results and insights. It is particularly noticeable in analytical and conceptual crudity. A long distillation process of philosophical argumentation about a set of interrelated philosophical problems leads to refinement, the use of new concepts and conceptual distinctions that are developed as argumentation goes on and advances the level of debate. Philosophizing from scratch cannot benefit from such refinement. At its worse, unfamiliarity with the philosophies of historiography and archaeology leads the book to expect arguments in historiography and archaeology to resemble the deductive structure of philosophic arguments. Without considerations of other philosophic case studies in the history and sociology of historiography and archaeology it is difficult to justify generalizing from this single case study to reach philosophic conclusions about historiography or archaeology in general.

Out of the Cave claims to explain the apparent absence of convergence of beliefs among archaeologists who studied the scrolls by their different prior beliefs, in the Bayesian sense of priors. Initially, as in science, different archaeologists assign different subjective values to alternative beliefs. However, unlike in science, the new evidence does not lead to convergence of these subjective values because in archaeology evidence is radically theory laden. Archaeologists, claims Ullmann-Margalit, display trenchant resistance to revisions in their beliefs and interpret away new evidence. This analysis should explain much more than the social history of the controversies over the Dead Sea scrolls; it should explain the social and theoretical divisions in the "human sciences." These divisions, it is argued, do not result from disagreements about "the facts," but from different prior probabilities. Reviving neo-Kantian distinctions, Ullmann-Margalit claims that archaeology's evidence consists of human artefacts that require understanding of meanings, the intention behind them. By contrast, natural sciences like Geology treat their evidence as natural products that have no meaning. This is quite an induction from a single case study… .

This thesis is over-simplistic. The natural sciences are hardly free of paradigms, resistance to new theoretical breakthroughs, as historians and philosophers of science at least since Kuhn have observed. Conversely, levels of consensus in some parts of historiography and archaeology indicate that a fairly heterogeneous group of "human" scientists that commence their inquiries with different prior beliefs are able to follow the evidence to a consensual agreement. Most significantly, the social history of the research on the Dead Sea scrolls that emerges from this case study is of an emerging local consensus over a "mini-paradigm" about the religiously Essene and geographically Qumran origins of the scrolls. As in the history of science, there have been dissenters, apparent anomalies, and puzzle solving leading to revisionist tinkering with the theory including conceptual reinterpretations. This case study offers no reason to distinguish archaeology from other sciences. Further, as philosophers of archaeology have analyzed, archaeologists are interested in much more than reconstructing original meanings of artefacts; they infer information about the past from unintended results of actions such as shapes of fields, patterns of animal bone dispersion around camp fires, remains of refuse and faeces, and layers of burnt remains of cities.

On the one hand, Out of the Cave distinguishes "wishful archaeology," a type of wishful thinking from "open-minded archaeology" that is "inter-subjective and free of ideology." For example, the Byzantine St. Helena practiced wishful archaeology when she travelled in the fourth century to the holy land and 'found' all the biblical sites she was looking for (and effectively determined some of the locations for inter-religious conflict ever since over sites that in all likelihood have no authentic significance). On the other hand, Out of the Cave claims that archaeological evidence is radically theory laden. Ullmann-Margalit recognizes that "scientific practice is mostly probabilistic, not deductive." (74) But she claims that the Bayesian approach is a normative, not a regulative ideal for archaeology. Subjective posterior probabilities do not converge under the influence of the evidence since "evidence and initial hypothesis are interdependent." (77) Ullmann-Margalit assumes that the very same theory is responsible both for hypotheses about events that took place for two hundred years prior to the destruction of the Jerusalem temple in 70 AD, and for the interpretations of the scrolls, first century historiographic accounts of the Essenes, and the archaeological material evidence. However, historians and archaeologists use different theories about the transmission of information in time to evaluate evidence. These theories are independent of each other and have been used and corroborated successfully in many different cases in different contexts. Such theories about the transmission of information in time through various mediums are independent from hypotheses about concrete past events. For example, the theories that are used to date graves or pottery are quite independent of hypotheses about who is buried in the graves or who were the potters. Evidence is of course theory laden, but no vicious circle of interpretation follows necessarily when many different theories are involved. In Clark Glymour's analysis of confirmation, for example, parts of theories "bootstrap" each other. There are only distant echoes in this book of the massive philosophical literature on confirmation and theory choice; a most appropriate reference to Whewell's concept of consilience of inductions, transitivity of evidential support from one case to another, is not followed by discussion of relevant more recent work of philosophers like Thagard on this topic, or Kosso's examination of mutual theoretical support in archaeology.

Instead of discussing scope, fruitfulness and the other cognitive values that assist in theory choice, Out of the Cave seems to advocate a rather vague and crude "gestalt," (89) a conjunction of evidential units in a deductive framework. This discussion ignores work on the epistemology of testimony that reveals why several highly unreliable but independent witnesses (such as criminals) can confirm hypotheses (such as who done it). Ullmann-Margalit correctly notes the significance of inference to the best explanation of the evidence (64), mentioning the possibility that the hypothesis that connects the Essenes with the scrolls and the Qumran site is better than its competitors. But this idea is left undeveloped. I would have developed this insight much further to combine it with the version of Bayesianism that compares the likelihoods of the evidence given alternative hypotheses, developed for example by Wesley Salmon and Elliott Sober.

The largest scope of evidence relevant for hypotheses on the identities of the authors, copiers and depositors of the Dead Sea scrolls includes the correlations between the contents of the scrolls, the peculiarities of the archaeological material finding in the Qumran site, and the descriptions of the Essenes in the first century historiographies of Josephus, Philo and Pliny. In the words of one of the most influential expositors of the link between Qumran, the Essenes and the scrolls, denial of this link

must suggest seriously that two major parties formed communalistic religious communities in the same district of the Dead Sea and lived together in effect for two centuries, holding similar bizarre views, performing similar or rather identical lustrations, ritual meals, and ceremonies… . [O]ne, carefully described by classical authors, disappeared without leaving building remains or even potsherds behind; the other systematically ignored by the classical authors, left extensive ruins, and indeed a great library.[1]

A Bayesian reconstruction of this comparison of the likelihoods of the correlations between the scrolls, ancient historiography and archaeological finds concludes that the probability of the evidence given separate causes is sufficiently unlikely for the common cause hypothesis to win almost by default.

The same evidence is insufficient for determining an answer to questions like: What are the information-preserving similarities between the theology and practices of the Essenes and those of Jesus, the early Christians, and the monastic movement? Did they have a common cause or separate causes? If there was a common cause, was it an Essene influence on Christianity, or a common influence on both, such as common beliefs and practices in first century Judea? According to Ullmann-Margalit, "conservative" Christians tend to stress the dissimilarities between the Essenes and early Christians, downplay the similarities and ascribe them to separate causes, whereas "liberal" Christians consider the Essene Community a transitional stage between Judaism and Christianity and so emphasize the similarities and ascribe them to a common cause, Essene influence on Christianity. Jewish historians and archaeologists sided with the conservative Christians, interpreting Essene doctrine as an ultra-strict orthodox variety of Judaism, obsessed with purity and defilement, rather than with spirituality and an alternative theology. Since there is no evidence for transmission of information from the Essenes to Jesus or his disciples, the likelihoods of the evidence given alternative hypotheses about the causal relations between Essenes and Christians are underdetermined. Following underdetermination, choice between alternative hypotheses is influenced by prior beliefs, religious wishful thinking in this case.

Overall, this book reads like a promising first draft. The preliminary work on the case study is philosophically quite useful and there are hints of philosophical insights that could have been developed in light of further readings. Many good questions are left unanswered, or presented as rhetorical questions whose answer should be obvious, or receive a superficial treatment in ignorance of the relevant philosophical literature. There is little argumentation here for a general philosophical theory of archaeology or of our beliefs about the past. Accordingly, the book has no concluding chapter. This first draft should have been followed by a few years of reading and thinking about the philosophies of historiography and archaeology, confirmation, theory choice, Bayesianism, and the epistemology of testimony. This slim volume could have evolved then through successive rewritings into a substantial and important contribution to philosophy. What a pity that it was rushed into print in this premature, unripe state!

[1] Frank Moore Cross, "The Historical Context of the Scrolls," in Hershel Shanks ed., Understanding the Dead Sea Scrolls, (New York: Random House), 1992, 25; quoted in Ullmann-Margalit 38.