Overcoming Our Evil: Human Nature and Spiritual Exercises in Xunzi and Augustine

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Aaron Stalnaker, Overcoming Our Evil: Human Nature and Spiritual Exercises in Xunzi and Augustine, Georgetown University Press, 2006, 330pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 1589010949.

Reviewed by T. C. Kline III, Independent Scholar


In Overcoming Our Evil: Human Nature and Spiritual Exercises in Xunzi and Augustine, Aaron Stalnaker undertakes an ambitious project in which he aims not only to provide an insightful comparison of two sophisticated thinkers, but also simultaneously to use this comparative exercise in order to argue for a particular approach to self-transformation and comparative religious ethics. To accomplish these goals, Stalnaker begins with two chapters describing and justifying his method of comparative analysis. For scholars who engage in comparative analysis, these chapters alone make the book worth reading. Following these introductory chapters are six chapters that constitute the comparative analysis of Augustine and Xunzi on "spiritual exercises," a term he borrows from Pierre Hadot. Stalnaker ends the book with a brief and suggestive chapter arguing for his larger claims about religious ethics and self-transformation in contemporary Euro-American society.

Given the grand scope of Stalnaker's project, he puts himself in jeopardy of leaving everyone unhappy with some part of the description and analysis. Yet, while in what follows I will discuss some weaknesses that exist in the analysis and structure of the book, Stalnaker accomplishes much more than one could expect from a single volume. He has added another rich comparative study engaging early Chinese figures with Western thinkers. The book stands well alongside Lee H. Yearley's Mencius and Aquinas and Karen L. Carr and P.J. Ivanhoe's A Sense of Anti-Rationalism, books that he himself recognizes as models for and predecessors to his own monograph. Furthermore, he presents a clear and sophisticated defense of comparative analysis in the study of religious ethics, a defense that ought to provoke others to take comparative projects more seriously.

Before turning to my critical evaluation of the various elements of Stalnaker's project, I must make two things clear. First, as mentioned above, significant comparative projects, regardless of how well executed, run the risk of leaving everyone unhappy. Comparative analyses rarely receive review from a true peer capable of offering a balanced critique of both elements of the comparison. I am a scholar of early Chinese philosophy specializing in Xunzi's writings and am not as well versed in the writings of Augustine. Given my own lopsided expertise, much of my critique focuses on Stalnaker's understanding and explication of Xunzi rather than Augustine. Second, Stalnaker relies to some degree on my writings about Xunzi in his own analysis. Furthermore, I am myself engaged in comparative analyses of Xunzi and Western thinkers. My criticisms, then, should be read against a background of broad agreement on his analysis of Xunzi's thought and deep sympathy and encouragement for his undertaking this type of comparative project. Like Stalnaker, I agree that comparative analysis thoroughly permeates most, if not all, good scholarship in religious ethics, though I do not always agree with his specific methods and justifications for pursuing such comparative analyses.

Stalnaker explains that the fundamental question motivating his comparative analysis is the question of whether or not human beings can truly transform themselves for the better, and, if so, how that transformation is accomplished. As he points out in various places in the book, contemporary philosophical approaches to ethics or moral psychology have little or no concern with self-transformation and its practices. Their analyses, though often sophisticated, remain decidedly thin and uninspiring when it comes to questions of how to become good. Stalnaker seeks to change this trend by placing the discussion firmly within a religious framework and undertaking a comparative analysis of two figures who, in contrast to contemporary scholars, develop sophisticated and compelling theories of self-transformation that take as a given the need to engage in what Stalnaker calls "spiritual exercises." According to Stalnaker, we need this type of comparative analysis because we have "contemporary needs for two things: the cultivation of richly grounded, virtuous human beings; and analysis of the problems and new possibilities created by societies that are culturally and religiously complex and disintegrated." [4] Through comparative analyses such as his own, he argues, we may be able to both recover or retrieve from ancient sources valuable insight about self-transformation that will be applicable to present circumstances, and come to an understanding of self-transformation that enables us to live peacefully if not always in harmony with people who engage in different traditions of spiritual exercises and the ontological and theological backgrounds they use to justify them. Much, then, is at stake in Stalnaker's analysis. He not only aims to reveal the character of self-transformation in two significant religious figures from different traditions, but also to convince us that we need to adopt forms of spiritual exercises for self-transformation and a particular method of comparative religious ethics.

Stalnaker begins his book with a sophisticated defense of comparative religious ethics. His method of comparative analysis involves what he describes as "bridge concepts." These concepts provide loose focal points around which comparative engagement can take place. In his study, he employs four such bridge concepts -- human nature, spiritual exercises, person, and the will. As should be obvious from the title of the work, the central focus of his book is the notion of spiritual exercises as modes of self-transformation. His discussion of human nature in Xunzi and Augustine provides what he correctly identifies as the framework within which their understandings of self-transformation are formulated. Person and the will become focal points of comparison in trying to further explicate the moral psychology underlying their understandings of self-transformation and its connection to their characterizations of human nature. The six chapters that contain the comparative analysis then break down into chapters focusing exclusively on either Xunzi (chs. 3 and 6) or Augustine (chs. 4 and 7), in order to explicate their understanding of a particular bridge concept, and chapters (chs. 5 and 8) comparing these understandings in order to better reveal the subtle differences and similarities in their theories. Overall, these comparative chapters are clear, insightful, and provoke further reflection on regimens of self-transformation and their theoretical justifications. For reasons mentioned above, I have little to say about the specific analysis of Augustine's writings. Instead I will focus on Stalnaker's understanding of Xunzi's spiritual exercises and the overarching claims about religious ethics and self-transformation Stalnaker believes are supported by his comparative analysis.

Broadly speaking, I will argue that Stalnaker could have more fully developed the explanation of Xunzi's spiritual exercises and religious ethics if he had chosen bridge concepts and a structure of analysis that better fit Xunzi's own understanding of religious ethics, or at least a framework of analysis more neutral with regard to the two thinkers. While I find the comparative analysis of Augustine and Xunzi to be insightful and thought provoking, Stalnaker continues an unfortunate tradition of examining Xunzi in terms of a conceptual framework rooted in the Augustinian tradition, a framework that distorts his analysis enough to prevent a richer picture of Xunzi's position. This distortion can be revealed by first focusing on the specifics of Stalnaker's analysis of desire and assent in Xunzi and examining how this analysis relates to the larger structure of the work.

In terms of Xunzi's spiritual exercises, Stalnaker correctly focuses on Xunzi's understanding of dispositions (qing), desire (yu), and its relationship to assent (ke); the intellectual virtues of emptiness (xu), unity (yi), and tranquility (jing); and the complex ways in which these elements of our moral psychology interact in self-transformation through various practices. Yet, there is a problem with the way in which Stalnaker distinguishes between desire and assent as motive forces within the self. While recognizing that Xunzi draws a distinction between desire and assent, Stalnaker often appears to reduce the significance of this distinction to what David B. Wong calls "the weak interpretation." Assent, though capable of trumping desires as a motive force, consists in long-term, more encompassing desires rather than immediate, narrowly focused desires arising directly from the senses. For example, in discussing whether or not Xunzi has a concept analogous to continence, a concept that plays a prominent role in Augustine's analysis of spiritual exercises, Stalnaker refers to judgments of assent as consisting of "reflective and deliberative desires." [259] If judgments of assent consist in reflective and deliberative desires as opposed to more immediate and spontaneous desires, then, as Wong has correctly pointed out, Xunzi's moral psychology collapses into something similar to that of Mengzi's in which there are different sources of desire in the self, some moral and some not, and self-cultivation consists in developing the desires arising from one source and not the other. This description of assent also makes Xunzi look much more like Augustine who also collapses all motive force to that of various loves, those that are properly connected to the love of God and those that aim away from God and thus, through pride, to the self.

Related to this distinction, Stalnaker also describes desires, the more immediate and spontaneous desires arising from our original dispositions, as problematic and in need of reformation because they tend to be short-sighted and selfish. The judgments of assent are, then, understood to be longer-sighted and non-selfish desires. The distinction can be conceived as being one between self-directed, non-reflective desires and other-directed, deliberative desires. This distinction very closely follows Augustine's distinction between self and other-directed loves or voluntas -- a distinction that explicates pride as fundamental to self-directed loves and thus sin. (Interestingly, as Stalnaker points out, Augustine believes there is only one properly other-directed love and that is love of God.) Yet, I would argue that Xunzi never describes desires as problematic because of their being self-directed as opposed to other-directed. In fact, Xunzi, unlike Augustine and most of the European religious and philosophical tradition, does not distinguish types of motive based on whether or not they are self or other-regarding, instead distinguishing between actions based on whether or not they are motivated by an assent that involves proper moral categories of perception and evaluation. For Xunzi, an other-regarding motive can be just as vicious as a self-regarding motive if it is not a judgment based on moral categories of perception and evaluation, categories that are embodied in the Dao and enacted through ritual practice. Even vicious actions for Xunzi can be thoroughly other-regarding, broad in scope, and reflective. In this instance, by describing Xunzi as concerned with the self/other distinction, Stalnaker too easily assimilates Xunzi's position to one more familiar to contemporary Western philosophical and religious ethics. Moreover, there is considerable merit to Xunzi's alternative method for distinguishing moral from non-moral motives and actions; great mischief and even wickedness has been done in the name of "others" and even with the express aim of benefiting those harmed.

I believe that part of the reason Stalnaker reads Xunzi in this way relates to his own choice of bridge concepts, which more closely track Augustine's own theory than Xunzi's. In particular, the choice of "the will" as a bridge concept for analyzing their respective theories of moral psychology skews the analysis such that at important points of the analysis of desire and assent, Xunzi's theory tends to be assimilated to a more familiar picture that reduces motive force in the self to a single kind -- desire -- and categorizes different types of desire. While Stalnaker recognizes that Xunzi, in response to Mengzi, tries to develop a more complex picture of motivation, he does not take seriously enough Xunzi's claim that we are always motivated by our assents and not our desires. He does try to explicate Xunzi through analogy to Harry Frankfurt's model of first and second-order desires modified by Charles Taylor's distinction between weak and strong evaluators. Unfortunately, both of these models of moral psychology are themselves not rich enough to encompass Xunzi's model, and also rest on the assumption that desire is the only motive force in the self.

Why should we care about these details of moral psychology when it comes to understanding Xunzi's program of self-transformation? First, I believe we cannot properly understand Xunzi's relationship to Mengzi and the rest of the early Confucian tradition unless we pay careful attention to the ways in which Xunzi believes he is responding to what he perceives as Mengzi's misunderstanding of Kongzi's (Confucius) teachings. Usually, in both Chinese and Western discussions of the differences between Mengzi and Xunzi, scholars begin their discussion with the two well-known slogans describing the character of human nature -- human nature is good (Mengzi) or human nature is bad (Xunzi). This juxtaposition is what first motivated Homer Dubs to draw the comparison of Xunzi to Augustine, the first scholar to do so, and it was this comparison that motivated Stalnaker's own choice of comparative subjects. While Xunzi and Mengzi do disagree about the fundamental character of human nature, this approach to the subject tends to overemphasize the importance of human nature in Xunzi's overall theory of self-cultivation. I would argue that concerns about false teachings, or daos, play a more significant role in motivating his theory of self-transformation than do questions about the character of human nature. On this point, Stalnaker, like others before him, overemphasizes the importance of human nature and underplays Xunzi's concerns about false daos and their ability to cloud our judgment through inculcating norms of perception and evaluation that do not adhere to the Dao and do not lead to harmony for the individual, society, or the cosmos. If it is our judgments, our assents, that motivate behavior, any practices that potentially distort our judgment constitute a serious threat to individual and social transformation.

Having made these points about Stalnaker's interpretation and analysis of Xunzi's theory of self-transformation, let me turn to a lingering concern about the overarching goal of comparative analyses. Stalnaker makes a very strong case for needing forms of spiritual exercises to accomplish self-transformation toward better, moral forms of life. Furthermore, he, like I, wants to be able to retrieve some of these practices for contemporary purposes, to be used to transform lives today. Yet our desire to retrieve these spiritual exercises must confront the problem of whether or not they can be divorced from their conceptual and cultural context and still remain effective practices for self-transformation. Stalnaker believes it may be possible to retrieve some practices once we untangle the complex web of relations between the context and the practices themselves, the kind of work he undertakes in this book. Unfortunately, I think we may have to be less optimistic about the possible success of such a project; at the very least, we must not underestimate its difficulty. These spiritual exercises, especially for Xunzi, are intended to inculcate cultural norms and standards into the participants, norms of perception and evaluation among other things. The practices, and more importantly the interpretive tradition that animated them, are long gone even in their cultural homeland of China. Attempting a retrieval of these practices amounts to reenacting the work of the original sages, a task that is made even more difficult by precisely the kind of disintegrated cultural context Stalnaker describes.

In closing, let me reiterate that any critique I may offer here should be seen in the light of my general admiration and respect for this monograph, and taken as an encouragement to further comparative work. Although I have reservations about aspects of Stalnaker's analysis of Xunzi and the degree to which his study at times privileges Augustine's assumptions and approaches at the expense of the earlier Chinese sage, Stalnaker provides us with an impressive comparative study that ought to spur further good work of its kind in the future, both his own and by others.