Painting Borges: Philosophy Interpreting Art Interpreting Literature

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Jorge J.E. Gracia, Painting Borges: Philosophy Interpreting Art Interpreting Literature, State University Press of New York, 2012, 324pp., $25.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781438441788.

Reviewed by Jacques Morizot, Aix-Marseille University


Jorge Gracia's book, Painting Borges, is a rather curious object, springing from an audacious intellectual challenge. It deals with three different domains: literature, art and philosophy, and focuses on the frontiers or the interactions between the three, in a quite subtle and unusual way. The outcome is a rich and vivid piece of writing and questioning.

The core of the project has to do with visual art as an instrument for interpreting works of literature. It is based on a selection of stories by Borges and a collection of visual works inspired by them. Some of these paintings or drawings belong to the personal œuvre of the artists selected (seventeen in all); others have been specially commissioned for an art exhibition and symposium in 2010 in Buenos Aires. In the trajectory of the author, this new item is located at the point of convergence of his epistemological interest in the theory of interpretation and his passionate concern for Cuban and South-American art in general.

The choice of Borges is not only motivated by a personal leaning but by the special blend of elusive thought and perfect prose characteristic of this writer. More than others, Borges is fond of playing with the most abstract ideas and is clever enough to embody them in fascinating short stories. What he writes are in effect fairy tales made out of concepts. Moreover, Borges is a major reference for writers, artists and even philosophers throughout the Spanish world and beyond. The reader recognizes with pleasure some of his most famous hits ("The Circular Ruins", "The Immortal", or "The Rose of Paracelsus", to cite just a few of them), but rather surprisingly, others that are no less significant are left out, in particular "The Aleph", "The Library of Babel", "The Lottery in Babylon", while "Pierre Menard" is present only indirectly. It seems that such a choice has no theoretical significance but is in keeping with the selection of issues that favors the labyrinths of identity and freedom over the combinatorial games that thrive in other stories.

How does Gracia conceive of his research program? The book is divided into two distinct parts, the first devoted to individual studies about particular stories and corresponding works, the other to more general topics, providing a theoretical counterpart of the case studies. . Each chapter is built on the same pattern: after a brief summary that recalls the main theme of the story and suggests some elements of interpretation, two visual works are taken into account. Both of them have a direct relation to the story mentioned but are original in style or medium. For example, Franco treats the jaguar in "The Writing of the God" as if it was a kind of cipher, inscribed on its skin and stripes, whereas for Kupferminc the presence of a tiger refers to the obscure tragedy of human history that resists elucidation. The presence of two images instead of only one reinforces a constructive dialogue between the literary material and its visual renderings, since in return they become privileged occasions to search in the original for what was overlooked upon first reading.

Gracia insists that these works are genuine interpretations and not only illustrations that get hold of some detail from the text or visually imagine an original setting to present its major theme. Even if the picture is focused on a determinate element, it aims at an iconic interpretation of the content itself, in the same manner as an analytical paper tackling a piece of writing. But this does not impose severe constraints, first because there is no univocal understanding of Borges' meaning in these stories, and secondly, because there are always multiple ways of visualizing a given story. A remarkable instance is "The Circular Ruins": whereas Menza is "attempting to capture the structure of Borges's thought" (83), "Kupferminc is primarily concerned with the formal structure of the work and its aesthetic qualities" (88). So the first picture retains the dimension of an unending dream embodied in a voluntarily enigmatic figure, the other the final burst of fire that could be reminiscent of auto-da-fe or maybe the stoic conflagration (ekpyrosis). From this point of view, works like La otra by Laura Delgado or The Immortal by León Ferrari are genuine masterpieces, both in their aesthetic result and in their suggestive power of interpretation.

In many respects, the book is highly valuable, providing additional and apposite information to the existing commentaries of Borges's works and new insights for extending the scope of Borges criticism, and most readers will be inclined to agree with the author's claims. . Nonetheless, some aspects of his analysis are open to question, or may be subject to limitations. In particular, three points are worth discussing.

(1) Gracia is definitely right to look for identity conditions appropriate for the kind of entities considered. His guiding policy is that "it is in the nature of a literary work that the text that expresses it be essential to it" (162), whereas it is not true either of philosophy or of artworks. This claim is sound and offers a cogent strategy against several problematic positions, convergent though independent: a strong realism which is indifferent to the sensitive features of writing, the kind of interpretative anarchism derived from Derrida and very influential in Latin America, and even Goodman's extreme sort of literalism, the consequences of which are so counterintuitive when applied to the case of Menard.

Taking the meaning of a text seriously, Gracia maintains, leads us to admit that "its translations are more or less close approximations, rather than faithful renderings of the original" (177). Of course, if the text is identified not only through the morphology of the words but also through their sonorities, rhythms, or figurative wording -- all that Wittgenstein would have counted in the category of 'secondary sense' -- it is not possible to say that a substituted text could be a perfect equivalent of the first. However the argument is convincing only when two isolated texts in different languages are compared, whereas usually a work is under a continuous process of being retranslated, so that it has always a whole array of more or less adequate translations. None of them is wholly satisfactory or permanent but each of them reveals connotations often unnoticed in the original. So it is often more effective to identify the work through the total sum of its adequate translations. This conclusion seems to be consonant with Gracia's insistence on the pragmatic level. What determines the reality of a given work is not its strict semiotic identity but rather the cultural background responsible for its identification, that is, sets of uses and practices, stemming from both authors and audiences. And at this point it seems impossible to avoid the current debates about hypothetical intentionalism.

(2) A more delicate situation is created by the gap between heterogeneous kinds of interpretation. At first sight, it would seem that one need not bother about this, since the disparity between language and its objects is a general fact. Besides, the discontinuous realms of the senses do not allow any easy transference among them. Nonetheless, what counts here are the interrelations between the interpretations themselves, and the legitimacy of confronting their content. Gracia holds that when "there is no common medium shared by the interpretandum and the instrumental interpretation, . . . the differences multiply exponentially" (210). Everybody should agree on this but the point at issue is in fact the possibility of establishing an effective connection between them. Gracia notices that "possible strategies seem endless" and he conceives of them as "bridges". For instance, the existence of a title is an indication that the visual work is referring to a given story if it shares the same title or conveys a transparent allusion to its content. It is indeed an index, an interpretive connector. But taking it as "an ontological bridge between the art and the literature insofar as they are texts" (217) is a gamble rather than a fact, even if the referential role played by the medium in the interpretive process is dependent on its semiotic nature.

The other strategies mentioned make wider and wider the range of acceptable attributions at stake, and it then seems difficult to decide when a reading is going too far. It is evident that the "loose-limits view" leads to the sacrifice of rigor; at the opposite pole, the "strict-limits view" would endanger any flexibility. The author claims to adhere to a moderate "conditional-limits view" that brings to bear the contextual factors involved in the course of interpreting. But if visual interpretations are to be regarded as mainly relational, it will be difficult to define a policy both open-ended and efficient enough to offer an appropriate regulation.

(3) The diagram that sums up the modus operandi of the interpretive process across different situations is also problematic. Gracia is confronting three major cases pertaining to a philosophical interpretation of a literary work (Danto's commentary on "Pierre Menard"), that of a visual work (the reflections developed by Foucault on Velasquez) and a visual interpretation of a textual work (such as those offered by the paintings selected in this book). These three forms of interpretation are treated as exactly on a par since each of them includes three levels (the original author, Garcia as the interpreter, and the reader), each level being structured by the relation between an interpretandum and the resulting interpretation. Such an assertion is definite but is not clearly defensible.

First, is a strict parallelism of forms of interpretation the most convincing hypothesis? In support, it could be argued that any interpretation must indeed share some formal traits with any other. What is more important in reality lies in the differences of aims and ranges brought into play. Danto is looking for a model that could account for artistic gestures like Warhol's Brillo Boxes or Levine's decision to rephotograph existing photographs. Borges's story offers a fictional key for such unclassifiable events. By contrast, Foucault encounters Las Meninas as an attractive riddle, though not in the way of an art historian looking for some hidden message. His intention is not to interpret it but to grasp through it something essential to understanding the beginnings of the classical age. Just as the unclear reflection in the mirror is the mark of what is really important in the painting, the implied figure of man, invisible in itself, is a necessary condition to give sense to various forms of discourse. Destefanis's project is still altogether different. His painting offers a sort of continuation of, or perhaps a means of uncovering an unspoken fact in, Borges's narrative. It would be incorrect to claim that the painter suggests an improper reading because Borges offers no conclusion and, more profoundly, because his conception of a story is somewhat akin to the setting of a trap. When the three cases are treated in parallel fashion, the cost is the erasing of their proper coordinates, leaving as a result an impression of deceptive simplicity.

Secondly, is it pertinent to think that the same mechanism is being repeated in different forms of interpretation? This amounts to saying that any interpretation bears solely upon the interpretandum engendered by the preceding one. Such uniformity through heterogeneous levels is probably misleading, inasmuch as Gracia (or any other reader as well) does not interpret Danto's reading without drawing from his own reading of Borges's whole opus as well as other writings. The structure of the situation has probably nothing to do with the regular geometry of stairs, without for all that showing the complexity of a Borgesian maze. One may rather conceive of an intricate network where threads are neither entangled nor quite separate. The challenge issued by art is how to take part in it without invalidating it. In the end it relates to what can be regarded as a blind spot of the book, namely, the question of authorial intent for visual works of the sort considered (239). Is there an objective boundary between a creative work on its own and an interpretative comment on that work? It would be reassuring to give a positive answer. Unfortunately, the two possibilities beget difficulties or frustrations and neither answer is easy to support.