Panpsychism in the West

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David Skrbina, Panpsychism in the West, MIT Press, 2005, 336pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262195224.

Reviewed by David Cunning, University of Iowa


This is a very interesting, and I think important, book. It is not without problems, some of which are considered below, and some of which might be regarded as intractable. But first a survey of the general themes of the book is in order.

One of the themes is that the doctrine that "all things have mind or a mind-like quality" (2) is pervasive in the history of human thought. The list of figures to whom Skrbina attributes the doctrine is impressive. Some are notable philosophers of the ancient period: Thales, Anaximenes, Parmenides, Heraclitus, Anaxagoras, Empedocles, Plato, Aristotle, Epicurus, Zeno of Citium, and Cicero. One of Skrbina's aims is to argue that panpsychism is not just a hiccup in the history of philosophy. In ancient Greece and Rome panpsychism was the predominant view, Skrbina argues, and was defended by thinkers that we have otherwise taken very seriously. After a hiatus that is traceable to the dominance of Christianity (63), panpsychism becomes pervasive again in the early modern period. A number of lesser known figures embrace a version of the view, but also Bacon, Spinoza, Newton, and Leibniz. Hobbes appears to be committed to panpsychism, argues Skrbina, even if he does not follow his own argumentation to its panpsychist implications. Locke does not endorse panpsychism, but he allows that it is an intelligible view and a contender.

Skrbina then argues that a substantial thread of these panpsychist views stretches to the present day -- from the early moderns to the German idealists; from Peirce and James to Dewey and Whitehead; from Thomas Edison to 20th-Century scientists such as David Bohm. David Chalmers subscribes to positions of which panpsychism is an "inevitable" consequence (242), and Galen Strawson is a panpsychist by his own admission. If Skrbina is right, panpsychism has been embraced by some of the greatest thinkers in the history of philosophy and science. We know "Pierce's more famous work in logic, semiotics, and positivism" (155), but we need to consider the good thinking that informs his other work, and we need to reconsider other figures as well.

A related theme of the book is that panpsychism has not received a fair treatment. Against the background of the entrenched view that it is crazy to attribute mentality to things like trees, rocks, and particles, panpsychism appears to be absurd (217, 263-7). In some cases, even the thinkers that Skrbina identifies as committed to views that entail panpsychism reject it on the ground that it is too unlikely (82, 172, 198, 218-21). We might smirk when we read of the minded "holons" of Arthur Koestler, for example, and Skrbina himself admits that panpsychist views often sound ridiculous (227, 235). However, a panpsychist view cannot be expressed accurately in the terms of a language that is laden with the theory that bodies are inert and unthinking (192, 247), and so will continue to sound ridiculous until there is a Kuhnian paradigm shift in which that theory is abandoned. A consequent difficulty for the case that Skrbina is attempting to make is of course that, to the extent that the 20th-Century scientists that he considers have accepted panpsychism, they have been regarded with suspicion by the larger academic community (217), and so might not have the kind of stature that would incline us to give the view another look.

A third central theme of the book is that panpsychism has important ethical implications. If it is true that every creature is in some sensed minded, then we should not regard any of the objects that surround us merely as equipment to be manipulated for our purposes (223-8, 256, 265-9). In a Heideggerian vein, one of the ideas here is that, as things stand, we do not merely harm our fellow minded creatures but are constrained to a stance towards ourselves and others that significantly limits our possibilities.

The book has a number of problems and a number of strengths. One of the strengths is that it isolates and identifies no fewer than than nine independent arguments that have been offered for the doctrine that everything has a mind or mind-like quality (250-1). The figures who offer these arguments often do so without explicitly characterizing them, and without reflecting that there is a broad historical pattern in which panpsychism has been regarded as the single best solution to a number of perennial philosophical problems. These include the problem of how minds and bodies interact, the problem of how bodies behave in an orderly manner if they are not intelligent, and the problem of how mentality can emerge from things that do not have minds themselves. Skrbina is arguing that panpsychism has been a pervasive view in the history of human thought, but he is also (at the end of the book) attempting to defend the view itself, and his reconstruction of the many arguments that have been offered in its favor contribute to both ends.

Another strength of the book is in the sheer number of panpsychist thinkers that it has uncovered. It is easy to get the impression that no intelligent figure in the history of philosophy or science has been a panpsychist, or that if they have, their acceptance of the view must just be an eccentricity. We might presume that an otherwise intellegent thinker's acceptance of the view is like Kepler's insistence that the planetal orbits must correspond to the five Platonic equilateral solids. Kepler held the view, but some things are better left unsaid. Skrbrina is arguing that a staggering number of thinkers have taken seriously the view that everything has a mind, and that if the view is an embarrassment now it was not an embarrassment then.

Another strength of the book is in its application of what is in effect the Leibnizian view that a complete mechanistic explanation is not a complete explanation simpliciter. We can quantify bodies and predict their behavior, and when we are successful we might presume that we have uncovered all that there is to them. There is a danger in doing this if there are ways of uncovering any remaining features of bodies and if our current practices are such that we would never think to utilize them. We do not know the existence of other human minds by any kind of direct experience, presumably, and we would not know the minds of other creatures in this way either (258).

The book also has a number of potential problems. One is that it does not put restrictions on what can count as mentality, and so the result that panpsychism has been a predominant view in the history of human thought becomes somewhat vacuous. Skrbina is aware of this objection (249), so perhaps there is just no consensus on the issue of how pressing it is. He makes clear that he is not aiming to define mentality, allowing that a view is panpsychist if it "simply holds that, however one conceives of mind, such mind applies to all things" (2). He adds that we should not be overly anthropocentric (18), as it might turn out that what we have been picking out as mind in our own case is very different from mind in others (2, 249). There is an obvious semantic question, though, about how different the latter can be and still be counted as mental. There is also a question about the commonalities between the figures that Skrbina identifies as panpsychist. A figure might express sympathy with the view that everything has a mind, but if he holds that a mind just reduces to soft spherical atoms (Lucretius, 52-3), or that mind is to be understood functionally or even behavioristically (185), it is not clear that we have located any important intersection with the ontology of a thinker who takes mind to involve consciousness and subjectivity. The problem is exacerbated if a view is panpsychist so long as it attributes to all things a mind-like quality. Indeed, the prospect that Skrbina is aligned with philosophers like Chalmers becomes questionable if the mind that is posited by these philosophers is what others would identify as a particular kind of organization of active bodies. Skrbina has established that a number of thinkers use a variant of the word 'mind' to pick out things that they include in their ontologies, but it is not clear the extent to which these thinkers thereby have anything in common.

Another problem with the book is that, in some cases, the evidence that it offers in attributing panpsychism to a particular thinker is extremely inconclusive. In defending the view that Plato is a panpsychist, for example, Skrbina points to a passage from the Timaeus in which Plato argues that the existence of a human soul attached to its body is entailed by the body's composition of the four elements. Skrbina then argues that Plato is committed to the view that anything that is composed of the four elements has a soul (39-40). Skrbina does not explore Plato's motivation for the view that the existence of a soul attached to its body is entailed by the body's composition of the four elements; he says that it is the weak link in the argument, and that "Plato seems to take this for granted, as he makes no argument on its behalf" (39). Presumably, however, Plato is simply reflecting the view that is found in Leibniz and many of his Eastern predecessors that there is a difference between the mind-projected unity of a herd or collection and the true unity of elements that are unified by a mind or soul. Skrbina does not offer any evidence that Plato holds that all combinations of elements are true unities, and such evidence is not to be found. The case for the view that Plato is a panpsychist is therefore weak. Indeed, Skrbina says that there are three panpsychist arguments in the texts of Plato, but that the other two depend on the argument presented above. There are other instances in which Skrbina's attribution of panpsychism to a particular thinker is hasty, but note that these are the exception.

Another potential problem for the book is that as it progresses Skrbina appears to endorse a perspectival view of truth according to which panspsychism and the views that oppose it have never conformed to objective reality, but are instead perspectives that we can take on reality (233, 259, 268-9). The question then arises about what we are doing if we reject materialism or dualism in favor of panpsychism. Apparently, we are holding that the panpsychist perspective on reality is preferable to these others. In addition, the thesis that panpsychism is bolstered by its predominance in the history of human thought is the view that the panpsychist perspective on reality has been taken by many distinguished philosophers and scientists and that we should consider taking it as well. It is fairly clear from the text that Skrbina would not regard this as an objection but as an elaboration of his view. A problem is that the perspectival view of truth is discussed only briefly, but appears to constitute a prong of the defense of the case that he is attempting to make.

These problems aside, the book is still very impressive. It raises a number of very important questions about the resistance that panpsychist views have faced at every turn, and it suggests a number of important directions for future research. If Skrbina is right, a hypothesis can far too easily become an unrevisable axiom, and this has happened in the case of some of the fundamental debates about matter and mind.