Paradise Understood: New Philosophical Essays about Heaven

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T. Ryan Byerly and Eric J. Silverman, (eds.), Paradise Understood: New Philosophical Essays about Heaven, Oxford University Press, 2017, 365 pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198794301.

Reviewed by Evan Fales, University of Iowa


Here is a new volume about heaven, a topic to which not very many anthologies have been devoted in the recent Anglo-American philosophical literature. It is a collection of 17 essays, paired to cover eight topics that have challenged philosophical and theological thought about human existence in the afterlife in heaven. It appears that all the authors are Christian, or at least writing from within the Judeo-Christian soteriological perspective.

The afterlife raises a number of perplexities, which we might place under two general kinds. There are puzzles about what the goodness of heavenly existence consists in for the saints; and there are questions of a metaphysical and epistemological nature about what it is to experience eternal life in an incorruptible state of beatitude. The two are, of course, in many ways interconnected.

Those who (like myself) are entirely skeptical about the very existence of an afterlife, and a heaven -- or hell -- in which it will be domiciled, will likely be inclined to dismiss such a project as a delusory exercise, and a waste of philosophical effort. But that would be overly hasty. Anyone who finds thought experiments heuristically illuminating can (with a bit of thought) see that topics, such as this, in the philosophy of religion are a fertile source of conundrums whose exploration can illuminate issues that theists and atheists alike puzzle over.

Thus, reflections on the goodness of heaven proceed under the constraint that a heavenly existence is supposed to be maximally good for those who achieve it, by asking what, in fact, such a maximally good existence might look like. We are allowed, in constructing such an ideal, to remove other constraints (such as those imposed by the possession of ordinary human bodies subjected to ordinary processes of deterioration). But what constraints, exactly, are to be removed, and why? Here, our authors appear to be guided by two primary considerations: congruence with what hints the Bible, especially the New Testament, provides, and intuitions about the ideal conditions for human flourishing.

Puzzles attend both aims. First, the lineaments of Biblical eschatology are, like so much else in Scripture, all too often notoriously unclear and historically understood in diverse ways. A quick example: it is almost universally supposed that the afterlife endures for eternity. But the New Testament describes it as lasting for an αίών (literally, an eon), which can mean an age, or long period (it having been common to divide history into such ages). Now a good case can be made for understanding αίώνιον in this context to mean 'everlasting,' 'without end' (cp., e.g., Mt. 25:46); but then it appears that punishment for the damned is also everlasting -- which chafes against universalism (the view that all are eventually saved, stoutly defended in some quarters, although only in the present volume for animals -- see Shawn Graves, Blake Hereth, and Tyler John). With one commendable exception (Richard Tamburro), the contributors to this volume seem not particularly concerned about such exegetical difficulties. And for philosophical purposes, though not soteriological ones, perhaps it doesn't matter that much: it remains an interesting question whether life everlasting is a condition to be desired, and if so, under what conditions.

The range of issues that fall under our second heading are more metaphysical and epistemological. They include questions about how much the saints in heaven know (Ted Poston, Jonathan Kvanvig), about the status of morality and freedom among the citizens of paradise (Rachel Lu, Timothy Pawl and Kevin Timpe, Brian Boeninger and Robert Garcia, Richard Tamburro, Katherine Rogers), and about the metaphysics of resurrection (Robert Audi, Eric Yang and Stephen Davis, Christopher Brown, Hud Hudson). Here, we inevitably confront the possibility of miracles, the mereology and mechanics of resurrection, criteria of personal identity, and the location of paradise, inter alia.

I do not have nearly the space required to do justice to all the contributions to this volume -- those mentioned, and a couple of others as well. So, with due apologies, I shall have to be selective, my comments guided mainly by my own interests and reactions, rather than the intrinsic merit of individual essays. The volume begins with a helpful introductory survey by the editors, followed by an essay by Eric Silverman that tackles the question whether the saints exist in a state of stasis or can undergo change, and one by Rogers that comments on a range of positions defended by other contributors, in the light of views staked out by Anselm.

Silverman tackles a dilemma created by the doctrine that our heavenly state is one of perfection (on the one hand), which seems to suggest that any deviation from "peak experience" can only be a come-down, and the fear that eternal bliss would be a recipe for crushing boredom. There certainly are passages, e.g. in Revelation, that suggest that various activities are on the menu, but they seem heavily weighted toward praise and adoration. Might we be so changed (1 Cor. 15:51-56) that these activities are infinitely engaging, never tedious? Perhaps: but would such monomania be an improvement, or something of a caricature of the fulfilment of the many facets of our teleological ordering? Silverman plumps, plausibly I should think, for a heavenly program that makes room for the pursuit and realization of a wide variety of goods, and of increasing appreciation of them over time. At stake, in any event, are fundamental questions about human felicitude and, correspondingly, about human nature. How much could God change our natures when the trumpet sounds, in the interest of human beatitude, before we have become no longer human, and thus no longer genidentical with the human seeds from which we sprang?

In several entries, this theme is carried further in explorations of the range of cognitive and affective states that the saints might be expected to enjoy. "He will wipe away every tear" (Rev. 21:4): does that mean that the saints will not -- perhaps even will be unable to -- experience doubt, sorrow, regret, remorse, sympathy, and the like? If so, are not the saints affectively impoverished in ways that preclude the exercise of a whole range of virtues?

Lu offers us a tour of the positions of major theologians of the medieval period respecting the debate over which virtues will be possessed by the saints, and which will be left behind. At stake are certain theological claims (e.g. Aquinas' distinction between natural and infused virtues), but also exploration of the teloi with which the various virtues are associated, and questions that emerge respecting the relevance of those ends to a heavenly existence.

Several contributors consider whether various affective and developmental states are plausible contributors to the psychological terrain of the saved. Could the virtuous increase in virtue, even indefinitely, during their everlasting paradisical careers? Pawl and Timpe argue that (at least in certain respects) they could: there's always room for improvement; and thus eternal life is an adventure, not a static condition of supreme ecstasy. In a careful study, Adam C. Pelser makes a case for certain saintly "negative" emotions, especially sorrow, with its close association with feelings of sympathy, care, and love -- hence, that the saints, like perhaps God himself, can (and would lack certain virtues if they did not) experience sympathy, loss, and fellow-suffering.

Finally, T. Ryan Byerly examines the possibility of the saints exercising what he calls the virtues of repair -- in particular the virtue of forgiveness, given that there is no wrongdoing in paradise. He discovers several ways in which forgiveness might nevertheless be exercised, using, as his working conception of forgiveness, a good-will analysis: "When S forgives R for offense O, S wills that O leads to a good for R." (p. 139) By way of clarification, Byerly notes (p. 138) that ill will, in his sense, need not be voluntary at all; one might presume the same for good will. But Byerly argues that the good will must be freely offered -- hence, presumably, not involuntarily.

Perhaps free will isn't a sine qua non for heavenly residence; in their defense of animal universalism, Graves, Hereth, and John (GHJ) engage the currently lively discussion about (non-human) animal eschatology, arguing that a perfectly just and loving God would not deny such bliss as sensitive creatures can enjoy, rather than oblivion. Why stop at conscious beings? GHJ leave open the question of non-sentient animals. But even plants, though they do not experience pain or happiness, are ordered toward certain ends that they pursue with either success or failure. An ancient, flourishing oak is surely a thing of value, even if unappreciated by human beings.

GHJ rest a good deal of their case on the point that non-human animals have this advantage over us with respect to meriting heaven: they can't sin, so hell is not for them. They also consider sentience highly relevant; indeed, take it to be a necessary and sufficient condition for moral status. Both seem problematic. As for sentience, its borders may well be fuzzy, subject to sorites paradoxes. As for sin: Capuchin monkeys (who have an intelligence comparable to that of the great apes), for instance, seem to be quite capable of intentional cruelty and bullying, not only of conspecifics, but of animals of other species. Of course, Capuchins display differing temperaments. Would a particularly sadistic Capuchin be admitted to heaven? Or purgatory?

More generally, I find it quite hard to envision how such an eschaton works, once we expand our purview beyond the familiar dogs, cats, and pangolins. The female parasitoid wasp (who can see, and no doubt feels pain) lives and dies to paralyze a caterpillar and bury it with her eggs; her offspring then devour the living prey. Would this rather distasteful ritual be engineered out of heavenly wasps? Would they even enjoy their altered ecology? If so, would they still be parasitoid wasps? Similar questions arise for, e.g., tapeworms and black widows (who eat their mates). One doesn't quite know what to say. Does God enter them into a kind of blissful "matrix"?

At the heart of Robert Audi's wide-ranging article are questions about the nature of embodiment and re-embodiment in the Resurrection. Audi is right, I think, to focus on embodiment as a key relation in the ontology of human personhood. The relation is one on which, as Audi puts it, the person animates his/her/its body. Animation is presumably (at least) a causal relation of some sort; but how does it work? About this, space forbids adequate elaboration; but Audi expands on the relevant mental/physical connections elsewhere (Rationality and Religious Commitment, Ch. 10). One option is to take seriously the possibility that God himself is in some way an embodied person, and to model our thinking about Him on what can be made of human mind/body relations. While leaving open a range of options, Audi is not unsympathetic (in the human case) with the view that the physical is sufficient for the mental, and that a kind of causal closure principle can be respected (with respect to the former) on the view that mental events are token-token identical with physical ones, but that explanations of, e.g., actions require mental descriptions of these events. There are questions a-plenty that arise here (e.g., about the nature of human freedom, and about the sense in which the mental qua mental can "cause" physical or mental change). But Audi's view, at least on the supposition that God might in the relevant sense be embodied, seems to elude objections based on causal closure.

Three chapters that follow concern aspects of our understanding of the general Resurrection. One is a problem almost as old as Christian thought: what is the ontology of the genidentity relation between pre-mortem human persons and their post-mortem continuation in the Resurrection? Brown calls this the Problem of Personal Identity: PPID. The second problem did not, to my knowledge, become acute until the modern period: where, exactly, is heaven?

Yang and Davis offer a newish account of the composition of the Resurrection body. Theirs, like the other contemporary positions they consider, takes more or less literally the teaching of 1 Cor. 15 (and, arguably, Revelation) that resurrected persons will be embodied. What Yang and Davis aim at is a resuscitation of something like the venerable Patristic understanding of the Resurrection body as constituted by a re-assembly of the earthly body. That view is saddled with numerous difficulties; Yang and Davis look to develop a version that eludes those objections. Their core response to a range of problems with criteria for bodily compositionality is that a kind of voluntary sustaining action by God is needed to constitute a set of particles as a bodily continuant. If your watch is taken apart and later reassembled with replacement of some of the worn pieces, it remains that very watch, God willing (and only if God is willing). (To be sure, God can't make it the case that those watch-parts, arranged watch-wise, compose a human being or a star.) However, Yang and Davis seem then committed to thinking that, should theism prove false, there are no composites whatever. Yang and Davis do aver, inter alia, that their view can solve the cannibal case (God can will that the spatial regions in the cannibal's body occupied by parts of the victim Christian's body are not part of the fusion that comprises the cannibal.) Not so: suppose the cannibal subsists from infancy upon an exclusive diet of Christians till all of his body-volume is occupied by parts of former Christians, then himself converts to Christianity (you are what you eat). Is Mr. Cannibal out of luck? Finally, Yang and Davis argue that God couldn't reassemble both the atoms once comprising the 10-year-old Davis and those comprising Davis at his death into separate Davis resurrection bodies. But why not? Doesn't God manage something even more extraordinary with Jesus' body every Sunday?

Reasons of space preclude my devoting adequate discussion to Brown's Thomistic solution to the PPID. At its heart lies the idea that human persons are, in this life, body and soul (the soul is the form of the person); when an individual dies, the body decomposes but the soul, as it is an "active" form, enjoys substantial survival until the general Resurrection, when God miraculously re-embodies it: "Since the human soul has an act that does not make use of the body, that is, the act of understanding . . . , the human soul is a subsistent thing for St. Thomas, not an abstract object (as are the substantial forms of non-human material substances)." (p. 253, author's italics) Unfortunately, I have never understood this key claim. A form must be an abstract object; it cannot per se perform any act whatever. Perhaps that form can act independently of a human body -- but only insofar as it orders a substance, whether bodily or not.

In his short piece, Hudson presses the advantages of his proposal that we are resurrected in the hyperfuture rather than the future; that is, into a space-time block, distinct from ours, situated in an additional temporal dimension: hypertime. The conceptual resources of the hypertime model are fairly remarkable, perhaps even paradoxical: as Hudson notes with some bemusement, it allows, not only for a hypertime heaven but for a hypertime hell, and for the possibility that some (or all) human beings consigned to hell might also enter into eternal salvation in some hyperfuture. Might it go without saying (and Hudson doesn't say it) that perhaps some (or all) of the saved also enter into eternal perdition in some hypertime future?

One of the oldest puzzles about Paradise is whether, in the eschaton, the saints are capable of sin -- and, if not, whether they have free will anymore, and are able to profit from the superlative goods that require autonomy (and if not, why didn't God just create Adam and Eve as enjoyers of beatitude?). Boeninger and Graves, along with Tamburro, examine the question at some length. A decisive issue that underlies the discussion and constrains possible solutions is how, exactly, freedom is to be understood. Theists, more often than not, are committed to a libertarian conception of freedom (as are these authors); but what, from that perspective, are the necessary and sufficient conditions for freedom?

Boeninger and Garcia explicitly adopt as criterial a Principle of Alternative Possibilities (PAP), indeed, a stronger requirement: not only must it be possible for an agent to act in alternative ways, but, to be genuinely free in the morally relevant sense, the agent must have available to him actions that are sinful. But heavenly agents do not sin; yet, the goods dependent on freedom are, on the Free Will Defense, worth the risk of sin. Boeninger and Garcia focus on moral praise and blame, and engage at some length with the strategy, suggested by Pawl and Timpe, that saints may deserve moral credit for actions, taken pre-mortem, which helped to shape them into the sinless beings they become upon beatification.

But, so Tamburro observes (p. 314, n.18), Boeninger and Garcia are wrong to think that heavenly impeccability is a result of character perfection alone. Tamburro invites us to enrich the notion of freedom by appealing to the view that reasons are not causes, and that the exercise of freedom lies centrally in a rational agent's ability to act on any of their reasons, including ones not the most rationally compelling. Tamburro can then go on to argue that beatific communion with God in heaven can provide saints with decisive reasons to reject sinfulness, while leaving open to them choices that are significant. This seems to me an improved view, but one that still does not go far enough. One way to see this is to reflect on the fact that an agent's failure to act in the rationally best way is, so far from an exercise of freedom, a failure at perfect agency, either through ignorance, weakness of character, or incorrect reasoning. Consider an agent in whom none of these failings can be found -- consider God. Is He maximally unfree -- confined to making only random choices between options that rate as equally maximal in goodness (if such there be)? Or should we accept, as the pre-eminent criterion of free agency, the capacity to be guided by (good) reasoning? To theists, I should commend the latter view, as more fundamental than PAP.

The volume ends with what might be thought of as a benediction -- two articles commending the blessedness of eternal life with God. Heavenly life, Walls argues, is a telos we fail to hope for on pain of despair. He considers in this light the famous equanimity with which David Hume reportedly faced his end. But I should think that Hume's frame of mind remains for us a mystery. Wells doubts the perspicacity, or candor, of Hume's inference that the Supreme Being (if any) would, on the evidence, have to be morally indifferent. The signal piece of evidence that Hume ignores, according to Walls, is the moral nature of human beings. I should beg to differ: Hume was acutely aware of the morally checkered record of humanity. For Wells, however, the signal fact that points to a moral Creator is the human approval of happiness and what is productive of it, and disapproval of misery and what produces it. Does Wells think that, absent God, human beings wouldn't care whether their existence is happy or miserable? Or, perhaps, that Darwinian natural selection could not produce social beings imbued with codes of conduct conducive to flourishing? Perhaps Wells is correct that Heaven is our true and best hope. Or perhaps one might accept the view of some of the Jewish sages, of Melville, and of Ivan Karamazov, that the greatest problem we face is how we can forgive God.

About Swinburne's measured closing reflections I shall say very little. Although I find areas of disagreement, it seems to me that he is refreshingly in accord with the essentially Augustinian conception of freedom I advocated above (p. 356).

The contributions to this volume should provide rewarding food for thought about a wide range of issues, to theists and non-theists alike.