Paradox and Platitude in Wittgenstein's Philosophy

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David Pears, Paradox and Platitude in Wittgenstein's Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2006, 150pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199247706.
Birkbeck, University of London

Reviewed by Danièle Moyal-Sharrock, Birkbeck, University of London


This is David Pears' revisiting of Wittgenstein's philosophy in five interrelated themes -- the pictorial character of language, the phenomenon of linguistic regularity, the 'private language argument', logical necessity, and ego. The book therefore covers, as Pears writes, the same ground as his Wittgenstein (1971), but in greater depth and detail; and, I would add, with the familiarity and expertise of someone who has travelled long and deep with Wittgenstein.

The notions of paradox and platitude are used unsparingly throughout the book, but one regrets that Pears does not devote a separate discussion, however brief, to their importance in Wittgenstein's philosophy. By 'paradox', Pears usually means: the rejection of a plausible assumption; and by 'platitude' is meant not only 'truism', but also 'familiar examples'. So for Pears Wittgenstein's use of platitudes is often nothing but his use of description (as opposed to explanation).

Pears begins with an image of the history of philosophy as a pulsar oscillating between critical and constructive philosophy. This image stays with us in the impression, throughout the book, that Pears' admiration for Wittgenstein's critical philosophy is tempered by the wish that he had been a more constructive (read: theoretical and science-based) philosopher. Pears quietly begrudges Wittgenstein his 'deeply-antitheoretical philosophy' (x), referring to his platitudes as mere 'oblique response[s]' (ix). And so it will be no surprise that the strength of Pears' book lies in his recognition of the manifold manifestations of Wittgenstein's anthropologism, and its weakness in the failure to go all the way with it, to let the anthropologism inform more deeply his appreciation of the philosophy.

Wittgenstein's Realist account of sense in the Tractatus was the Picture Theory of Sentences: sentences achieve sense by their words representing possible arrangements of things in the world. In the first chapter, Pears asks himself what led Wittgenstein to reject this 'beautiful theory' which, unlike logical atomism, was never dealt a mortal blow, but simply faded out of the early philosophy. He concludes that it was rendered otiose by (a) Wittgenstein's realization that isolated ostensive definitions are never enough to fix the meanings of words, and (b) his rejection of the Realist explanation of linguistic regularity. The next two chapters are devoted to showing us how these are spelled out in Wittgenstein's post-Tractarian philosophy.

At the point where it becomes impossible to characterize the correlations of words with things in an affirmative way -- the point where we run out of explanations -- what happens is that we stammer. Rather than stammer, Wittgenstein replaced explanation with description. But, however unavoidable, abandoning Realism (explanation) always smacks of paradox:

If the world is not the dominant partner in its relationship with language, what else will provide our sentences with their senses? The answer that Wittgenstein gave to that question in his later writings was 'What we do with them'. But that has an air of platitude. Of course it is what we do with them. But what is that if not that we attach the words to … things in the world? (3)

In Chapter 2, 'Linguistic Regularity', Pears attempts to elucidate this platitude.

Whereas Wittgenstein's abandonment of the Platonic fixity of meaning is not too difficult to accept, the difficulty for most commentators, Pears rightly notes, resides in the elusiveness of the alternative he offers; that is, the suggestion that linguistic techniques are the ultimate repositories of meaning (23). And the paradox here lies in the same place as the Protagorean idea that man is both measurer and measuring instrument. In one of the many enlightening images in the book, Pears writes that man's reactions have taken over the role of the graduating lines on the ruler and now serve as criteria for the application of his words. This paradoxical idea is, on Pears' view, the key to understanding Wittgenstein's later treatment of meaning. In an attempt to contain the paradox, Pears contends that the essential contribution to linguistic regularity is made by our common human nature. This, he claims, is the central pillar of Wittgenstein's philosophy of language, but it escapes us because conformity in judgments appears to be a matter of pressure to conform. Where most commentators anchor the inexorability of the must in social dynamics, Pears resists: 'I obey the rule blindly' (PI 219) means, for him, that the constraint comes from within -- from our own natures -- and not from any external force, and so there is nothing to be seen, and it is even questionable whether what we feel should be called 'constraint'. Here, one gets the impression that Pears takes Wittgenstein back a step, from the outer to the inner, and that he does this in an attempt to save Wittgenstein from the 'statistics' interpretation of linguistic regularity. But no need; Wittgenstein had saved himself:

This has often been said before. And it has often been put in the form of an assertion that the truths of logic are determined by a consensus of opinions. Is this what I am saying? No. There is no opinion at all; it is not a question of opinion. They are determined by a consensus of action: a consensus of doing the same thing, reacting in the same way. (LFM 183-4)

This is logic in action, and it certainly does result from peer pressure:

Nevertheless the laws of inference can be said to compel us; in the same sense, that is to say, as other laws in human society. The clerk who infers as in (17) must do it like that; he would be punished if he inferred differently. If you draw different conclusions you do indeed get into conflict, e.g. with society; and also with other practical consequences. (RFM  80-1)

Logical compulsion does not come from within, but from the pressures inherent in training (RPP II, 413) -- particularly as Wittgenstein sees training as resembling taming (BrB 77) -- and from the impossibility of playing a game whose rules you do not follow. What Wittgenstein means when he speaks of following a rule blindly is not that one follows it 'from within', but that one follows it with eyes shut (PI 224) -- that is, without hesitation or justification:

'How am I able to obey a rule?' -- if this is not a question about causes, then it is about the justification for my following the rule in the way I do.

If I have exhausted the justifications I have reached bedrock, and my spade is turned. Then I am inclined to say: 'This is simply what I do.' (PI 217)

Wittgenstein's application of his account of linguistic regularity to sensation-language is what generates the so-called 'Private Language Argument' (PLA) -- the topic of Chapter 3. On Pears' view, the essential idea of Wittgenstein's critique is that the language in which we report our sensations owes its meaning to the connections of our sensations with the physical world and cannot survive separation from it; but he does not consider Wittgenstein's other condition for setting up a language -- communication with other people -- sine qua non.

Pears questions the force of Wittgenstein's use of the inscrutability of isolated, ostensive definitions as an objection to the Private Language hypothesis. Granted, a single, exemplary application of a word is not enough to fix the way in which the technique of applying it is to be developed, but, asks Pears, why should Wittgenstein thus restrict the would-be private linguist? He would not be thus restricted to a single application of the word if he were coining a word in a public language. Pears argues that Wittgenstein would have rejected the hypothesis of a Private Language, on the sole grounds of absence of connection to the physical world. This, Pears takes to be the single essential pillar of the PLA, without which the distinction between being under the impression that one is reporting a sense-impression correctly and actually reporting it correctly is obliterated. His dispensing with the other condition allows Pears to suggest that the PLA does not rely on 'the dubious assumption that a language must actually be shared and could not be invented by a solitary speaker'; all that it requires is that the meanings of its words be preserved by their regular application to things in the physical world which would be accessible to other people if there were any other people around. What Pears misses here, however, is that it is the regularity of application that requires monitoring and, therefore, a shared language. Connection with the physical world is simply not enough.

Pears finds Wittgenstein's verdict on the possibility of a solitary language unclear; he finds that Wittgenstein side-steps the question, asking instead the related question of whether it is possible that there be only one occasion on which someone obeyed a (linguistic) rule, to which Wittgenstein's answer is an explicit no. Pears decides that the only firm conclusion that can be drawn from Wittgenstein is that a language 'must be sharable, even if it is not actually shared' (63). But the point now seems to have evaded Pears (perhaps because in the meantime his Crusoe has unwarrantedly stepped in to replace his Super-Crusoe): a language cannot be sharable if it has never actually been shared. The clear answer that Wittgenstein gave in PI is that the fixing of rules, though not all instances of following rules, demands publicity; or as Victor Descombes elegantly puts it, linguistic rules are rules that I can follow alone, but that I cannot be alone to follow.

In Chapter 4, on 'Logical Necessity', Pears measures well the tension between our consideration of logical necessities as indispensable conditions of all thought and Wittgenstein's anthropocentric treatment of them:

1.  logic seems to be made of harder stuff than the regular application of general words;

2.  the Conventionalism of his account of logical necessity steals the limelight, while its Voluntarism fails to cancel the implication of capriciousness;

3.  both his Conventionalism and his Voluntarism seem to be inconsistent with his rejection of all theorizing in philosophy.

Conventionalism without any mention of reasons would concede too much to spontaneity and seem merely capricious. Our acceptance of new patterns (changes in language) must be both spontaneous and rationally motivated: we do not have to make the change and in that sense it is arbitrary, but it is not capricious because there is good reason for making it (77). This is the line of investigation that Wittgenstein engages in 1929 and it leads to what Pears calls his Rational Voluntarism. The paradox here is the suggestion that the conclusion of a proof in logic is something that we do not have to accept. Pears disposes of the other two problems -- the need for logic to be harder than 'mere' linguistic regularity, and Wittgenstein's apparent theorizing -- in the single contention that Wittgenstein's outright rejection of all theorizing in philosophy ought to be limited in some way,[1] for the main obstacle to understanding his treatment of logical necessity is the implication that there is something optional about it.

The Rational Voluntarism that Pears brandishes in defence of Wittgenstein, however, overshoots the mark. Pears is certainly right that Wittgenstein's aim was to re-work the objectivity/subjectivity distinction by identifying the objective with what is intersubjectively agreed, but there is nothing rational about the intersubjective agreement. In speaking of a Rational Voluntarism at the origin of logical necessities, Pears comes too close to Dummett's full-blooded conventionalism. Certainly, the emergence of a new logical necessity is due to its successful career as a contingent proposition, but the 'petrifaction' -- as Wittgenstein describes it -- of what had been a mobile joint is no rational process. As Wittgenstein makes clear in On Certainty, though logical necessity may be conditioned by extra-linguistic factors, it is not rationally grounded on these; they may be the cause of a truth by definition becoming a logical necessity; they are not the reason or ground for its becoming so: 'This game proves its worth. That may be the cause of its being played, but it is not the ground' (OC 474); '… the language-game is so to say something unpredictable. I mean: it is not based on grounds. It is not reasonable (or unreasonable)' (OC 559). There is a link between the human form of life (e.g. human beings needing food and drink) and their language-games (e.g. with food and drink), the link is not a rational one; it is not grounded or justified by our form of life, but conditioned by it: "Indeed, doesn't it seem obvious that the possibility of a language-game is conditioned [bedingt] by certain facts?" (OC 617). By adducing (and contrasting) cause and reason in this sense, Wittgenstein is able to acknowledge the contribution of our form of life to grammar, whilst preserving the autonomy of grammar. Arbitrariness or ungroundedness must be preserved if we are to safeguard the autonomy of grammar.

In Chapter 4, Pears discusses two paradoxes generated by Wittgenstein's treatment of the concept 'ego'. The second of these is the claim that the pronoun 'I' is not a referential expression. Pears finds this highly paradoxical: 'if a person's name is used to refer to him, surely the personal pronoun 'I', which he alone can use to replace his name will also be used to refer to him' (115). Here, one wonders whether Pears has not too rashly dismissed Wittgenstein's discussions of first-/third-person asymmetry and description versus expression. Pears does not find persuasive Wittgenstein's claim that 'the mouth which says 'I' or the hand that is raised to indicate that it is I who wish to speak or I who have toothache does not thereby point to anything' (BlB 68): 'Both these procedures present me to my audience as the target of my reference and, therefore, as the target of their reference if they accept what I say and agree "Yes, you do have toothache". So why do these two procedures not amount to self-reference', asks Pears (127). Well, I suggest, simply because they do not present me to myself as the target of my reference. Wittgenstein's point is that the ordinary use of 'I' is not descriptive, but expressive, and there is therefore no 'epistemic line', as Pears thinks there is, between the person and the 'I' uttered by that person, and thus no reference.

Pears admits that Paradox and Platitude was written with the same conviction he held in his 1971 monograph, that Wittgenstein's thought owes much to an 'imagination that is essential to philosophy, but can so easily lead us nowhere' (x). In spite of that conviction, the positive direction of Wittgenstein's philosophy shines through. Perhaps because David Pears has taken us through some of the most tenacious problems in that philosophy, and has shown us the Wittgensteinian imagination at work -- and we saw that it was good.

[1] Indeed, I have argued that Wittgenstein himself limits it; cf. my 'Wittgenstein and Psychological Certainty' in Perspicuous Presentations: Essays on Wittgenstein's Philosophy of Psychology (Palgrave Macmillan, 2007), 214-16.