Paradoxes of Political Ethics: From Dirty Hands to the Invisible Hand

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John M. Parrish, Paradoxes of Political Ethics: From Dirty Hands to the Invisible Hand, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 283pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521873550.

Reviewed by Martin E. Sandbu, Wharton School, University of Pennsylvania


Good books on the history of political thought achieve two things. They enhance our understanding of how certain political concepts developed through a historical period and they uncover lessons in the histories of the concepts they study for how we understand politics today. Professor John M. Parrish's book, while devoting most of its attention to the former task, also offers a good deal of the latter.

I write this review during an election campaign that has occasioned more than the usual amount of accusations against the government. The Bush administration stands accused of lying, torture, murder, corruption, and a long litany of rights infringements and violations. Its supporters, of course, deny that any morally (or legally) questionable actions were committed at all, and that in any case, whatever was done was the right thing to do given the threat of terrorism.

Theoretically, both sides could be partly right. The government's critics may be factually correct about what the government did, and its defenders may be right that officials had good reasons to believe that what they did was necessary to protect the nation from great ills. This would force us to choose between three unsavory options. The first is to argue that lying, torture, and murder are not crimes after all when committed in the pursuit of the greater good. The second is to retain our intuition that these are grave moral transgressions, but admit that there are situations in which a person ought to commit great wrongs. The third is to say "So much the worse for the common good" and insist that these actions may never be committed, no matter how great the calamity the avoidance of which seems to necessitate them.

This is the "problem of dirty hands" that Michael Walzer made famous in his 1973 article with the same title. Walzer did not dwell on the third option, dismissing it -- rightly in my view -- as not morally serious. So long as there are power relations in the world, he who holds power does have the fates of other people in his hands, and there must be some cases (even if fewer than he prefers us to believe) in which keeping his hands clean amounts to abdicating responsibility: "If he remains innocent … he not only fails to do the right thing (in utilitarian terms), he may also fail to live up to the duties of his office (which imposes on him a considerable responsibility for consequence and outcomes)".[1]

That leaves the politician -- and the analyst of politics -- with a dilemma: Either to claim that actions that we normally consider evil are not in fact evil in the circumstances of politics or to say that they are indeed wrong, but that it is sometimes right to commit wrongful actions. Each answer is paradoxical, though in slightly different ways. The former is morally and intellectually discomfiting. It demands that we revise deeply held moral intuitions, and must explain why it seems to us that there are true moral dilemmas in such cases. The latter, in contrast, validates the perception that we are contravening morality even in doing what is for the best; but for that very reason it risks landing morality in incoherence, for (as Walzer asks) "how can it be wrong to do what is right?" Knowing what we know about the human propensity for cognitive dissonance reduction, therefore, we should not be surprised if much effort in political theory had gone into either dissolving or dissembling this paradox.

That this is indeed the case -- and that this has been a task political philosophers have set for themselves since the birth of Western philosophy -- is the premise of the story professor John Parrish tells in his book Paradoxes of Political Ethics: From Dirty Hands to the Invisible Hand. In Parrish's account, three moments in the history of Western political thought developed an original and acute understanding of a dirty hands problem, each culminating in a particularly influential solution to it. The three periods are the confluence and friction of ideas between classical (especially Roman) political thought and the new Christian ideals, the secularizing political thought of the Renaissance, and the theories of the emergent capitalist or "commercial" society in the 17th and 18th Centuries. The book explains the unfolding of related yet original ideas into their prime expressions in the works of, respectively, St. Augustine, Thomas Hobbes, and Adam Smith.

The beginnings of Western thinking already contained the seeds of a dirty hands problem in the ambivalence towards political action. Plato's Republic takes as a serious challenge that the actions politics necessitates for the common good are actions wise men would not want to pursue. A similar worry threatens the value system of republican Rome, a society which prized political and military action, and in which citizens were expected to put their loyalty to the state above all. To this Roman ideal “no challenge could be more potent than the suggestion that there could possibly … be irresolvable conflicts between what the utility of the republic required … and what individual honorableness or moral rightness might demand” (p. 48). Cicero's De Oficiis (On Duties) was written to forestall this problem with the first kind of solution sketched above. For Cicero, there could only be apparent conflicts between these two values. What is morally wrong or dishonorable might seem like it was in the city's interest, but this would almost never be so in actuality. More intriguingly, Cicero allowed the converse possibility -- that what might seem morally wrong may not in fact be so. His argument is grounded in the fundamentally social nature of human beings, which makes our ultimate moral duty the security of society and the state, so that public utility trumps conventional morality in the rare cases where they truly conflict.

The advent of Christianity, however, brought with it theologies that could only be hostile to the underlying premises of Rome's value system and Cicero's defense of it. For in these theologies, loyalty to the state was subjected to loyalty to God. Also Rome's emphasis of earthly success and glory conflicted with the early Christian rejection of pride and a radical critique of inequality. The tendency in early Christianity, therefore, was to a wholesale rejection of politics. This changed, however, as Christianity became the religion of political rulers, and the Christian church itself became a locus of power. Christianity was forced to live side by side with a politics still understood through the spectacles of classical culture. Parrish's book devotes a full chapter to St. Augustine's attempt at reconciling the two, in the City of God.

Two moves of St. Augustine's are of particular importance. The first is his conceptualization of virtue as a correct ordering of loves. This system allows self-love a role, even moral worth, provided it is subordinated to love of God and equal to love of one's neighbor. The second is his emphasizing that vice imitates virtue, given that sinful motives can produce effects similar to more virtuous dispositions. Nor is this a fortunate coincidence; it is, rather, part of God's providence that men's imperfect natures can be harnessed for good results. God made "use of the Roman people's appetite for glory, to fashion the courage and self-control they exercised in pursuit of praise into a functional imitation of virtue" (87). One particular earthly good that political action can secure is peace -- which can "serve as a shared foundation from which the two cities [heavenly and earthly] can pursue their ultimately differing ends" (88). This partial overlap between godly and earthly goals creates a possibility for pursuing politics out of love for others, and this justifies many of the actions the exercise of power necessitates. The Augustinian theory marks a crucial shift to intention as opposed to outcomes as the morally relevant feature of action -- which follows from the imitative relationship of vice to virtue: We cannot tell from the outcome whether an action was sinful or virtuous, a theme to which Parrish returns later in the story. Augustine's theory resolved the dirty hands problem in the form in which it challenged the early Christians; this explains why it would come to seem unsatisfactory once the Renaissance reevaluated classical moral views at the expense of Christian ones.

The second part of Parrish's book starts with a discussion of Machiavelli, who took the opposite turn in the dilemma between political imperative and conventional morality. Unlike Cicero and Augustine, Machiavelli does not try to defuse the dirty hands problem. He explicitly says that the actions one must undertake to succeed in politics are not morally good; instead, the (rare) good politician must learn how not to be good. His view is what Parrish describes as an aristocratic solution to the dirty hands problem -- the political leader must take the burden of evil upon himself to secure the good for the rest of us. Thomas More's Utopia takes the same stark premise -- that given how the world and humanity are, a virtuous politics is impossible -- but arrives at a democratic solution (though a utopian one). In Parrish's reading of More, the problem of dirty hands is solvable only through a general reform involving the people at large, in which they, like his Utopians, renounce the institutions and policies of European countries of the time for a communal mode of living without private property. The suggestion is that even without extirpating pride from human nature, political reform can in theory eliminate the injustice caused by pride -- but such reform requires fundamental change in the life of the people itself, and cannot be "contracted out" to a leader who learns not to be good for the sake of the people.

This analysis sets the stage for Parrish's discussion of Hobbes, perhaps the most deeply probing chapter in the book. Some of this story is well-known: the near-universal moral permissibility in the state of nature is transferred to the sovereign in political society. It would seem that the dirty hands problem is defused by the conclusion that the sovereign can do virtually no wrong. Parrish adds an interesting account of how Hobbes's religious arguments, which he thinks are mistakenly disregarded by many readers of Hobbes, disarm the worry that Christianity is incompatible with politics. But Parrish argues that there is another, darker side to Hobbes's solution. The social contract is an act of authorization, which means that the Hobbesian sovereign exercises the rights of his subjects on their behalf. The sovereign is only blameless, as are we in obeying his every command, because we collectively are morally permitted to do anything -- but

when we claim moral permission for our governments to undertake on our behalf such deeds as Hobbes's sovereign must inevitably make its business, we do so at the cost of acknowledging ourselves to be inescapably like the creatures Hobbes's state of nature envisions. (181)

To the extent that our views of state authority are still Hobbesian at their core, Parrish seems warranted to accuse them of covering up our own moral liability qua political communities.

The Hobbesian account of the state, then, does not according to Parish dissolve the dirty hands problem, but rather democratizes it (like More), while at the same time concealing it (unlike More). This shift to the people as bearers of moral responsibility for political evils is paralleled in an analysis of their responsibility for private evils, which constitutes the third part of the book. Augustine's insight about the outward indistinguishability of vices and virtues at this point reappears in Pierre Nicole's writings, in the service of the Jansenist view that true virtue is rare and that most of the good deeds we see in the world must in reality be the products of sinful pride. "The art of government, then, according to Nicole, is necessary in order to direct the vicious energies of human beings effectively into channels that will produce public benefits" (200). There remains a tension here, since these "energies" do indeed remain sinful. Bernard Mandeville's Fable of the Bees, in contrast, offers a similar analysis but a radically different evaluation, by celebrating the vices of everyday life as necessary for the benefit that commercial activity affords society, and indeed for "the very Existence of the Civil Society" itself (215, quoting Mandeville's Fable).

This sanitization of vice is completed by Adam Smith's "rehabilitation of pride against the old Augustinian moral psychology" (235). There is for Smith a perfectly proper type of self-love and pride, namely that which can be approved by the "impartial spectator" of his Theory of Moral Sentiments -- and indeed the very device of the impartial spectator as the basis of moral judgment is psychologically based on a concern for the regard of others. "And so, once the proper corrections have been made, it becomes possible for self-love, or more precisely self-approval or self-esteem, to take its place as the indispensable precondition of correct moral judgment" (241). Smith rejects Mandeville's paradoxical justification of private vices -- and with it this whole aspect of the Augustinian tradition -- by denying that these are necessarily vices at all. But he keeps and develops the political implications of Mandeville's view, namely that the public benefit lies in the satisfaction of the demand founded on those self-interested desires whose viciousness Mandeville perversely celebrated and which earlier authors condemned, but which Smith redefines as innocuous and overall benign. As a result, there is less need to "guide" self-interested motivation in the direction of the public good, as Nicole and Mandeville had claimed, and Smith famously advocates a system of "natural liberty" (yet as Parrish makes clear, his is no systematic laissez-faire philosophy). Smith, then, cleanses the dirt from the hand that secures the common good by making the hand itself invisible.

In the introductory and concluding chapters that bookend his work, Parrish sensibly underlines that the dirty hands problem itself, far from being merely an abstract philosophical puzzle, has a history -- as we should expect from a challenge to ethical thinking that has always manifested itself particularly in questions of politics. Parrish's goal is "to investigate, not the problem of dirty hands per se, but rather a succession of dirty hands problems, each of which could tell us something important about the people and the conceptual frameworks that find the problem, or don't find the problem, troubling" (18). At the same time,

there are analytical similarities between the problems of political ethics these authors wrestle with which are just as important as the various differences between them. The problems these thinkers confront are not identical, but there is a striking family resemblance between them that is itself both a puzzle to be explained and a diagnostic indication that bears on our treatment of the problem itself.

These remarks illustrate how a "conceptual archeology" can be relevant not just to historians of thought but also to scholars working in contemporary political philosophy. Tracing out the implications of this relevance, however, is something Parrish leaves to the reader. That is not a criticism of the book, which does what it does well. It is simply to say that the book raises as many questions as it answers about how we should think about politics today. I finish with some thoughts on that point.

Parrish suggests that the history of the dirty hands problem is the history of theories of value pluralism. That seems too broad. While the dirty hands problem can only really be a problem if values are plural, it is not itself the problem of value pluralism or moral dilemmas, just one such problem. I find Parrish more congenial when he emphasizes that dirty hands must be understood as a particularly political problem (which must mean, of course, that even if the dirty hands problem is in some way solved, we should not expect that solution to also resolve the difficulties of general value pluralism in one fell swoop). There is a limit, then, to how the dirty hand problems of these earlier periods apply to us today, in which the dark side of political action is presumably less that of sinning or jeopardizing one's salvation than that of unjustly harming others in the pursuit of the greater good. We may wonder in particular whether the "privatized" dirty hands problem is a problem for us at all -- why should we be concerned about base motivation in commercial life provided people do not harm one another?

One answer may be that today, power is to a considerable extent shifted from the conventional political sphere to the commercial sphere. Since the rise of the modern business corporation, commercial decisions are not merely questions of private vices, but start to resemble more and more political decisions in the sense that they may affect the lives of thousands or millions of individuals, far beyond the corporation itself. At the same time, the Smithian justification of self-interested motivation in commercial activity remains and is in fact frequently applied to centralized corporate decisions as well as the decentralized decisions of individuals in competitive markets. Modern economics has achieved remarkably nuanced understandings of exactly when, how, and in what sense self-interested commercial behavior produces "public benefits" -- but the moral evaluation of those actions remains very much a live topic. To mention just one way in which Parrish's archeology is useful today: Hobbes's theory of representation contains insights that seem to apply to joint stock corporations, where, on some views at least, shareholders have authorized directors and executives to act on their behalf, much like Hobbes's sovereign (although much more limited in scope). Smith's invisible hand account, it seems, may conceal from us that, to the extent we are shareholders, corporations represent us, and the moral wrongs they do "may ultimately be laid at our door" as Parrish says in the different context of the Hobbesian state (181).

Perhaps, then, Smith does not have the final word after all. If that is the case, Parrish's analysis does indeed carry more than archeological interest.

[1] Walzer, "Political Action: The Problem of Dirty Hands," Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 2, No. 2 (Winter 1973).