Parmenides, Plato and Mortal Philosophy: Return from Transcendence

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Vishwa Adluri, Parmenides, Plato and Mortal Philosophy: Return from Transcendence, Continuum, 2011, 212pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826457530.

Reviewed by Richard Polt, Xavier University


Parmenides has survived the "parricide" committed against him in Plato's Sophist and in every philosophy of plurality and becoming. Despite the brevity of the fragments of his poem, supposedly titled On Nature (Peri Phuseos), and the apparent simplicity of its central thought -- "being is" -- Parmenides continues to nourish speculation, historical research, and philological debate. We now even have Parmenides Publishing, which has printed or reprinted over half a dozen studies of the pre-Socratic to date. The series Continuum Studies in Ancient Philosophy currently includes no fewer than three books on the topic: Raymond Tallis' The Enduring Significance of Parmenides, Lisa Atwood Wilkinson's Parmenides and To Eon, and Vishwa Adluri's Parmenides, Plato, and Mortal Philosophy. Adluri's work stands out for the radicality of its argument, the subtlety of its interdisciplinary interpretations, and the forthright passion that motivates it.

Adluri's radical reading denies that Parmenides is the enemy of plurality and becoming. How can this be, if the poem bluntly argues that, since "being is," becoming is unthinkable and being is eternally one -- pastless, futureless, and featureless? The answer begins in plain sight, on the surface of the poem, but this surface has been ignored all too often by readers who assume they already know what Parmenides stands for.  Parmenides does not in fact say "being is." The phrase (with its sundry tortured variations) is uttered by an unnamed goddess who addresses the poem's narrator. The poem begins in the first person, describing the narrator's (Parmenides'?) passionate journey ("as far as thumos might reach," fragment 1, line 1) to the gates of the divine domain. The goddess then welcomes the voyager and presents two accounts: an account of the "truth" (monistic being) and an account of mortal opinions about the mutable cosmos. The usual assumption is that the first-person proem is window dressing: like the dactylic hexameter, it is a remnant of or concession to the prephilosophical, mythmaking culture from which Parmenides is emerging. The goddess' first account is assumed to be Parmenides' own theory. Her second account is then problematic: if there is nothing but being, how can there "be" a plurality of phenomena, opinions (whether true or untrue), and opiners? Parmenides the monist turns out to be an extreme dualist, due to his uncompromising split between reality and appearance. Our task is then to construct a logical solution to this split -- if not within Parmenides' theory itself, then in our own physical or metaphysical theories.

In contrast, Adluri proposes that Parmenides' theme is precisely the conflict between the constructs of logical theories and the lived reality of our changing world. The youth (kouros) who narrates the poem strives to escape this world; he is presented with a vision of a timeless reality; but the goddess' second speech directs him to "return from transcendence" to the changing cosmos. Parmenides does not resolve the contradiction between being and becoming, but presents the tension between the two, a tension that must be narrated rather than summed up in an atemporal theory. Thus, "Parmenides' genius consists not in launching a method of logical argument, but in documenting a basic experience of life" (38). The poetic form of Parmenides' writing is not window dressing at all, but is essential to the mythic mediation between eternity and temporality; myth recounts the journey that is mortal existence (7, 11, 18-19, 29-31, 39-40). (For another recent appreciation of the mythopoetic character of Parmenides' thought see Wilkinson, Parmenides and To Eon.)

Adluri's passionate concern is the tragedy of this journey: the world that the kouros desires in vain to escape is not merely a world in motion, but a world that moves us emotionally -- the realm of "hateful birth" (12.4) and fateful perishing (19.2). The goddess is immortal, not in the superficial sense that the day of her demise will never arrive, but because she transcends temporality itself; we mortals, however, who can at best glimpse such a state through the exercise of our reason, must fail to transcend time and death. We seek "metaphysics" to save us from our finitude, but we inevitably remain subject to "physics" -- the realm of generation and decay. It is not that Adluri denies all eternal truth: phusis includes stable and knowable dimensions. But when we embrace atemporal laws as a substitute for or distraction from our mortal finitude, they become deeply deceptive (2, 16-17, 79). Adluri thus suggests an ethics of "mortal rectitude" that would avoid the illusory comforts of metaphysics (20, 41, 172). At his most defiant, he rejects monism in general, including monotheism (2-3); however, no such rejection can be final if "we are as metaphysical as we are mortal" (6).

Finitude concerns each of us personally, and Adluri is candid about his personal stake in his investigation: he studied with Reiner Schürmann at the end of Schürmann's life, and witnessed the vitality ebb away from this unusually gifted teacher (3-5). Schürmann's reflections on natality, mortality, and the individual whose singularity escapes metaphysical structures were borne out in his own existence and his own undoing. Much as Plato bears witness to the life and death of Socrates, Adluri pays tribute to his teacher implicitly and explicitly throughout this book that is, in a sense, Schürmann's "biography" (4). Parmenides, Adluri admits, allows him to express his own and Schürmann's philosophy -- which is not to imply that he has not learned from the pre-Socratic (34).

Adluri's interpretation of Parmenides thus has a confessed point of view, but it is by no means a mechanical imposition of Schürmann's concepts on the ancient text. Adluri works with the literary, religious, and linguistic dimensions of Parmenides' words, showing a fine attention to detail. His interpretive skill is on display not only in the body of the book, but also in the appendix (137-156), which presents a new translation of Peri Phuseos with helpful notes.

Adluri's work deserves a place on the reading list of every student of pre-Socratic thought, but one could not consider it the definitive work on Parmenides. He does not pretend to an exhaustive account of the literature, and his direct analysis of the goddess' speech on being is surprisingly concise (72-77). Adluri relies on the reader's familiarity with established analyses of the text and rarely rehearses these discussions in detail. Sometimes his readings are tenuous. For instance, he makes a good case that in early Greek, thumos, unlike psyche, indicates an aspect of human life that has to expire at death (21-28); but is it fair to conclude from the use of thumos in the first line of Parmenides' poem that the mortal condition is front and center in the philosopher's concerns (54-55)? Adluri rightly observes that the goddess presents a speech that is directed at an individual and attempts to persuade him; but can we conclude that Parmenides is a deeply dialogical thinker (64, 76) when, in the surviving fragments, the kouros never utters a word in response to the goddess?

Adluri's discussion of non-contradiction could also be developed more carefully. He claims that "'at the same time' is the tacit and forgotten basis of the principle of non-contradiction, a basis that is taken for granted, as if the principle existed outside of time" (72). This may be true of the goddess' speech, but certainly not of Plato (Republic 436b), Aristotle (Metaphysics IV), and many later logicians. In any case, Adluri has raised the crucial question of whether Parmenides' goddess correctly derives timelessness from the principle of non-contradiction or surreptitiously presupposes time in this principle itself; but the question calls for a more thorough investigation.

There is also a difficulty in interpreting the goddess as "the arch-critic of metaphysics" (84) in her second, cosmological account. In Adluri's usage, "metaphysics" refers to any attempt to make logical sense of becoming in terms of stable structures (16-17). So "metaphysics" includes theoretical physics -- such as the cosmological fragments of Peri Phuseos, which seem to present patterns and explanations, not singularities. The "return from transcendence" has to be read between the lines or inferred from facts such as the very existence of the poem that recounts the journey (51).

Adluri's reading of Parmenides is the heart of this book, but it also contains an excellent interpretation of Plato's Phaedrus that brings out its thematic parallels to Parmenidean thought. Adluri does not, as one might expect, concentrate on the noetic vision of eternal being described at Phaedrus 247c-e. Instead, he considers the entire dialogue in terms of its treatment of mortal individuals, who can be loved and who die. The Platonic question, according to Adluri, is "what does it mean to be a finite, singular, ephemeral mortal whose mortality cannot be preserved, but whose logoi can be?" (99). Against Derrida's well-known critique of Plato's supposed privileging of speech over writing, Adluri argues that the Phaedrus problematizes language as a whole, both written and spoken, due to its tendency to abstract from singularity. Socrates and Plato try to develop a mode of discourse that is directed at individuals in their finitude. The central issue in the dialogue, then, is not writing as a pharmakon (remedy/poison), but Socrates himself as a pharmakos or sacrificial victim (113-114).

Adluri's rich account of the Phaedrus adds persuasiveness and resonance to his necessarily somewhat speculative approach to the fragments of Parmenides. We might adduce two more Platonic texts that support Adluri's position. Plato's Parmenides represents the old pre-Socratic as a master of dialectic, and not as its slave: we must, he says, play the "laborious game" (137b) of taking logos as far as it can go; after this exercise useful for youths (135d), we can think properly. Plato seems to tell us that Parmenides, unlike the hyperrationalist goddess of his poem, is a mortal thinker who has tested the limits of abstract ratiocination. As for Socrates' concern with singular mortals, consider the kind of knowledge that he represents himself as seeking, first and foremost, in the dialogue on the nature of knowledge.  He wants to know which Athenian youths are most promising (Theaetetus 143d). When, later in this dialogue, he caricatures the "philosopher" as one who overlooks individuals for the sake of Man (174b), he is not describing Socratic philosophy at all, but the disengaged theorizing of his interlocutor, the geometer and astronomer Theodorus. Adluri is quite right to find a "return from transcendence" in Plato, and in the light of the Greek theme of knowing oneself by knowing one's limits, his reading of Parmenides becomes compelling.

Adluri concludes with a criticism of Heidegger, whose revolutionary retrieval of the pre-Socratics lies in the background of many of Adluri's interpretations (see especially Heidegger's 1942-43 lecture course on Parmenides). Adluri argues that Heidegger subscribes to a Lutheran program of salvation in history that distracts him from singular mortality, and that his analyses of being-toward-death in Being and Time are formalistic (129-133).

On the whole, Adluri's work is a stimulating return to early Greek thought from a contemporary but not merely contemporary perspective, grounded not only in the realities posited by philosophy, but in the reality lived by existing philosophers. Adluri's further research extends beyond Greek thought to Sanskrit epic. We can look forward to more of his provocative studies of ancient texts informed by vivid existential concerns.