Paving the Great Way: Vasubandhu's Unifying Buddhist Philosophy

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Jonathan C. Gold, Paving the Great Way: Vasubandhu's Unifying Buddhist Philosophy, Columbia University Press, 2015, 322pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231168267.

Reviewed by James Duerlinger, University of Iowa


In this well-written book Jonathan Gold explains and defends the philosophy of Vasubandhu as it appears in arguments presented in Vasubandhu's Abhidharmakośabhāṣya (AKBh), Vyākhyāyukti (VyY), Viṃśatikā (Viṃś), Triṃśikā (Triṃś), and Trisvabhāvanirdeśa (TSN). The book's appendix includes translations of the arguments that Gold explains. His goal is to explain the unifying elements of Vasubandhu's philosophy as it appears in these five treatises. He does this by isolating Vasubandhu's recurrent treatments of causality and scriptural interpretation that reveal a coherent philosophy. Gold uses Vasubandhu's reduction of reference to a separate self to reference to a causal continuum of aggregates to provide a causal framework that enables him to explain Vasubandhu's other reduc­tion­ist arguments.

In Chapter 1 ("Summarizing Vasubandhu") Gold argues against Erich Frauwallner's 1951 thesis that there were two Vasubandhus, one who wrote the AKBh and another who wrote the Viṃś, Triṃś and TSN. In the remainder of the book Gold tries to set aside traditional doctrinal interpretations as much as possible and use textual interpretations of Vasubandhu's work to explain the meaning and basic philosophical motivations of the theses and arguments it contains.

In Chapter 2 ("Against the Times") Gold characterizes Vasubandhu's philosophy as expressed in the AKBh by reading his argument against the true existence of past and future phenomena closely so that he can be in a position to discuss how the argument may have been extended across his other works. Vasubandhu's argument in the AKBh is directed against the Kash­miri Vaibhāṣika thesis that past, present and future phenomena truly exist. Gold clearly explains Vasubandhu's account of four reasons the thesis was thought to be true and four different versions of the thesis. He then explains Vasubandhu's four arguments against the four reasons the thesis was thought to be true. Gold calls attention in his account of these four arguments to: Vasubandhu's belief that the traditional notion of an entity changing or becoming active is incoherent, to Vasubandhu's distinction between how entities exist and how they are experienced, and to Vasubandhu's claim that to grant proxi­mate causes inevitable, unmediated results is morally perilous. Gold argues that for Vasubandhu past and future phenomena are not causally efficacious and that what it means to say that something exists is that it is causally efficacious. So Vasubandhu, he claims, is committed to the view that causality itself does not truly exist, since Vasubandhu denies the true existence of past and future phenomena.

In Chapter 3 ("Merely Cause and Effect") Gold explains Vasubandhu's argument in AKBh III.18 that a transmigrating self does not truly exist, Vasubandhu's account in AKBh I.41-42 of perception, cognition and agency, and his refutation in AKBh III.100 of the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika theory that wholes and parts are causally related. He first argues that Vasubandhu reduces reference to a transmigrating self to reference to a causal continuum of the aggregates of mind and body. Likewise, Gold says, Vasubandhu reduces reference to consciousness as agent of cognition as distinct from object of its cognition to reference to a causal continuum of momentary consciousnesses, each causally produced by its immediate predecessor. Finally, Gold says, Vasubandhu replaces the theory that there is a causal relation between parts and wholes with the theory that there is only a causal series of separate parts. He concludes that Vasubandhu prominently employs the idea of a unitary causal line in these arguments to explain phenomena. He calls this Vasu­bandhu's "causal reductionism."

In Chapter 4 ("Knowledge, Language, and the Interpretation of Scripture") Gold argues that since Vasubandhu grounds effective reasoning in the view that existence can only be determined through causality, it provides for him a guide to the interpretation of scripture. According to Vasubandhu, because in scripture the Buddha speaks to ordinary beings who lack the capacity to understand the way things really are, reductionist reasoning is employed to avoid the use of scripture by such beings to justify the false constructions for which the scriptures were intended as an antidote. What seems to be a reference to the continuity of an entity, for instance, Vasubandhu reduces to a reference to a causal series of separate mental events that only appear to be one thing, like a line of ants, or like fire moving across a field. To illustrate further this kind of argument Gold explains Vasubandhu's argument against there being a cause of the destruction of an entity and his argument against the non-existence of an entity being a cause of the conception of its non-existence. It was Vasubandhu's desire to combat dogmatism and literalism in the interpretation of scripture, Gold argues, that motivated his philosophical reasoning. Gold calls upon the VyY to complete his account of Vasubandhu's interpretation of scripture. Gold argues that although Vasubandhu acknow­ledges that it is taught in scripture that the ultimate nature of all phenomena is inexpressible, he does not think that this teaching vitiates the use of reductionist reasoning in the interpretation of scripture.

In Chapter 5 ("Vasubandhu's Yogācāra") Gold explains Vasubandhu's distinctive form of Yogācāra philosophy and argues that it was prefigured in the AKBh, where it is argued that shape is not a substantial reality. Vasubandhu's Yogācāra provides a causal mode of explanation that accounts for all events as "appearance only" (vijňapti­mātra). Gold explains how in the Viṃś Vasubandhu argues that nothing is other than the mind, and how in the Triṃś and the TSN Vasubandhu draws together the basic doctrinal and conceptual vocabulary of the Yogācāra tradition and forms an elegant, coherent system. Gold then explains his version of Vasubandhu's doctrines of the three natures and the storehouse consciousness. Finally, Gold uses the assumption that the Mahāyāna-saṃgrahabhāṣya (MSGh), Mahāyānasutrālaṃkārabhāṣya (MSABh) and the Madhyāntavibhāgabhāṣya (MAVBh) were composed by Vasubandhu to attribute to him some distinctive Yogācāra views.

In Chapter 6 ("Agency and the Ethics of Massively Cumulative Causality") Gold explains the moral underpinnings of Vasubandhu's view of the workings of the cumulative karmic effects of actions. Gold argues that, since in Buddhism there is no self or its agency, morality is explained by the increasing attainments of virtue, knowledge, power and bliss, which are themselves understood as new freedoms that may be exercised on the Buddhist path. In Buddhism, volition (cetanā), Gold argues, is an aspect of every mental event that renders it neither a determined nor a random event. Volition is conditioned by cognitive content, which makes the key Buddhist moral activity the taking of vows, since vows causally condition the future mental continuum. As the cause of a result, Gold says, volition must be conjoined in causal potency with other volitions to produce a cumulative result. For the Yogācārins the causes of the world are mental events, which plant in the storehouse consciousness seeds that ripen into appearances. Gold ends the chapter with reflections on the importance of the length of the Buddhist path and its goals.

In Chapter 7 ( "Conclusion: Buddhist Causal Framing for the Modern World") Gold defines the Buddhist causal frame as a unified perspective implicit in Vasubandhu's doctrines of the three natures and the storehouse consciousness. This unified perspective, Gold says, is based on Vasubandhu's acceptance of the central goals of Abhidharma and the Buddha's doctrines of impermanence, dependent origination and no-self. In the Abhidharma Vasubandhu defends a universe of independent, momentary phenomena with definite causal results on the basis of his account of the distinction between phenomena that seem real and those that are causally effective. Although Vasubandhu regards causality itself as a conceptual construction, he assumes that it is only within this causal frame that phenom­ena can be judged real or unreal. So he asks of any phenomenon what the causal story is in which it plays a role. In Yogācāra, according to Gold, Vasubandhu defends the view that everything that appears is a concep­tual construction. Vasubandhu believes that we are to free ourselves from such conceptual constructions by accumulating the causes and conditions of the cessation of their continued arising. Gold claims that Buddhist causal framing can be explained and advanced without reference to Buddhism, and then he lays out his conception of the place of Buddhist causal framing in the modern world.

There are many more claims and arguments in Gold's excellent book than can be included in this review, in which only some of the most foundational are presented. Upon this foundation Gold builds a compelling case for a coherent picture of the conceptual structures that underlie Vasubandhu's work as a whole.

One concern I have is Gold's failure to explore what influence the Madhyamaka philosophy of Nāgārjuna might have had upon Vasubandhu's philosophical development or even to explore what the important differences are between the Madhyamaka philosophy of Nāgārjuna and the Yogācāra philosophy of Vasubandhu. To get a clear picture of the development of Vasubandhu's thought we need to understand his reaction to the Madhyamaka philosophy. Another concern is Gold's strange view that Vasubandhu's denial of duality (dvaya), which traditionally is understood as the denial that mind and its object are two separate realities, is the denial that mind and its object are both real. Gold's view changes what Vasubandhu calls the perfected nature of phenomena from their emptiness of being two separate realities to their emptiness of each being a separate reality, which likens Vasubandhu's view of emptiness to that of Nāgārjuna. This illustrates the need for Gold to explore further the connection between the philosophies of Vasubandhu and Nāgārjuna. Why does Gold not discuss the Buddha's Saṃdhinirmocanasūtra, which is used by Yogācārins themselves as the basis of the distinction between their own philosophy and the Madhyamaka philosophy?