Peirce, James, and a Pragmatic Philosophy of Religion

Placeholder book cover

John W. Woell, Peirce, James, and a Pragmatic Philosophy of Religion, Continuum, 2012, 224pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441168009.

Reviewed by Michael L. Raposa, Lehigh University


The logic governing the use of the word "pragmatism" is fuzzy enough to permit its application to a broad range of philosophical perspectives. As early as 1908, Arthur Lovejoy already had discerned that there were at least "thirteen" varieties of pragmatism. With the more recent attention directed by analytic philosophers like Richard Rorty and Robert Brandom to the thought of Peirce, James and Dewey, there is every reason to suppose that this number has grown significantly. Anyone, of course, is permitted to look for philosophical inspiration anywhere. With regard to the use of such a term, it hardly seems felicitous to argue over property rights.

Nevertheless, the broad application of the word as a label can blur the significant differences between certain philosophical points of view. In particular, the appropriation by contemporary analytic philosophers of some of the ideas of the classical American pragmatists may have resulted in the formulation of positions that move at right angles away from what the latter intended to claim. Illustrating that this is the case, in fact, is the first task that John Woell sets out to execute in his important and meticulously argued new book. At the same time, the book has a more ambitious, three-fold agenda. In addition to his contrasting -- here, both Peirce and James -- with some of their modern interpreters, Woell also wants to demonstrate that the continuity between these two thinkers is considerably greater than what is most frequently assumed. Finally, he hopes to show how their particular approach to pragmatism, properly understood, supplies invaluable resources for contemporary philosophers of religion. (In this regard, the title of the book is slightly misleading. Woell treats religious topics in an extended fashion only in the conclusion of the book so that what he offers here, as he himself acknowledges on page 152, is more of a prolegomenon to the sort of pragmatic philosophy of religion that he imagines as an exciting possibility -- and intends to pursue in another volume.)

In the first chapter, Woell explains how contemporary debates about realism and antirealism are largely irrelevant to the task of interpreting the pragmatism of Peirce or James. Rather than representing, as Rorty portrayed the philosophies of James and Dewey (with Peirce being something of an outlier), "an early pivot in what eventually becomes the linguistic turn" (24), classical pragmatism, on Woell's account, displays an altogether different trajectory. The debates about metaphysical and epistemological realism presuppose a "bifurcation of the world into the mind-dependent and the mind-independent" that Woell perceives as being imposed on the pragmatists' account by their modern interpreters (35). This is a significant hermeneutical error since Peirce and James rejected any such bifurcation.

Woell takes a similar approach in the second chapter's treatment of modern skepticism. In all of its various forms, skepticism is linked to a certain theoretical picture of the mind and of its relation to the world that the pragmatists worked hard to undermine. In Peirce's case, Woell demonstrates this with a careful and insightful reading of his early essays published in the 1860s in the Journal of Speculative Philosophy. Despite his rather dismissive talk about Cartesian "paper doubt," Peirce, as well as James, took the problem of skepticism quite seriously. At the same time, these pragmatists sought not to solve but rather to dissolve that problem, as Woell contends, "by rejecting the theoretical assumptions upon which radical skepticism is based" (72). The Cartesian conception of mind, of the sharp dualism of "knower" and "known" is completely alien to the pragmatic perspective.

The Kantian notion of an absolutely inconceivable thing-in-itself is subjected to a similar critique by Peirce and James. Woell's summary of these critical moves, unfolding in the book's first hundred pages, is both detailed (in a way that no brief review can capture) and thoroughly convincing. He effectively demonstrates that Rorty's Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature attempted to enlist the pragmatists in a philosophical game that they really had no interest in playing. Other contemporary commentators, many of them either influenced by Rorty's reading of the pragmatists or reacting negatively to it, have made the same sort of error. Woell's corrective interpretation of Peirce and James on these issues is a significant scholarly achievement.

Already linked by their shared rejection of certain well-entrenched philosophical perspectives, Peirce and James have a good deal more in common than that, as Woell proposes to underscore in the more constructive account that constitutes the book's later chapters. This is an important scholarly contribution as well, for which Woell ought to be applauded. Another lingering effect of Rorty's massive influence on the contemporary scholarly scene has been the distance that many perceive between Peirce's original formulation of pragmatism and the later accounts of James and Dewey. James's "subjectivism" has surely been exaggerated in this regard. Even if Peirce himself observed certain differences with James and was at pains to mark them by re-baptizing his position as "pragmaticism," nevertheless, the continuities between the two philosophers are numerous and important.

One of the most crucial arguments that Woell makes is for the metaphysical "neutrality" of pragmatism. While I am not prepared to reject the argument wholesale, I am also not as immediately persuaded by it as I am by some of Woell's other interpretive claims. A good deal depends, I suspect, on just how "fuzzy" one permits the logic of the word "pragmatism" to be. (Woell is opting for what he calls a "narrow" rather than a "broad" sense of the term -- see page 145.) Peirce's scholastic realism, his synechism, and his objective idealism all seem tightly woven into the fabric of his mature pragmaticism. Moreover, as numerous commentators (including Woell himself) have observed, the precise nature of the link between James's pragmatism and his later radical empiricism is not always easy to discern. Reading what James himself had to say about the connection sometimes obscures more than it clarifies. In any event, Woell emphasizes Peirce's and James's insistence on the "continuity of thought" in the chapter where he seeks to distinguish their pragmatic account of the relationship between mind and world from certain Cartesian and Humean predecessors (58-68). What motivates such an insistence if it is not Peirce's commitment to his synechistic metaphysics or James's to his radical empiricism? Is Woell admitting this but then later arguing that these strands, woven together in the writings of the classical pragmatists, can be loosened and separated, with the metaphysical neutrality of their pragmatic method thereby established?

I think that the claim is a crucial one because it looks like this sort of understanding of "pragmatism" is importantly presupposed in the "pragmatic philosophy of religion" that Woell intends to develop. This is an exciting project that I am eager for Woell to execute, my critical questions about how he has framed it in the book's conclusion notwithstanding. Most of those questions have to do with the original sources to which Woell primarily attends in these concluding pages. He notes the "sarcasm" that was very likely responsible for the exaggerated dichotomy between theory and practice that Peirce presented in his 1898 Cambridge lectures (154). But then Woell invests most of his energy here in softening that tension, doing the same after also observing it as operative in James's essay on "The Will to Believe." These are not the writings with which I would spend considerable time if my objective were to establish the groundwork for a pragmatic philosophy of religion inspired by Peirce and James.

These remarks are a bit unfair as the critical response to a brief prolegomenon. The projected volume that Woell announces here will likely treat such writings as Peirce's "A Neglected Argument for the Reality of God" and James's Varieties of Religious Experience at some length. I will predict, however, that any such treatment may find itself struggling with the "narrow" account of the pragmatic method that Woell has already begun to articulate here. What his conclusion does suggest is how normative for pragmatism he appears to regard the doubt/belief theory of inquiry unpacked in Peirce's Popular Science Monthly articles published in the 1870s. I must admit that, while "The Fixation of Belief" is perhaps the best known and widely read of all of Peirce's published articles, it may also be his worst (a judgment about which I concur with my mentor, Murray Murphey). It was written hastily, and its argument is misleading. Peirce almost immediately, and for many years afterwards, proceeded to qualify its claims (as well as those presented in "How to Make our Ideas Clear") as exaggerated.

Published thirty years later, Peirce's Neglected Argument supplies one of the clearest descriptions of his mature theory of inquiry. On that account, inquiry begins with the pure play of musement rather than with the stimulus of doubt. There, hypotheses are evaluated by criteria other than their ability to survive the shock of doubt. Likewise, James's proposal for a "science of religions," announced toward the end of his Gifford Lectures, seems to presuppose a pragmatism more capacious than anything a reader preoccupied with "The Will to Believe" would be likely to dream up in her/his philosophy.

What I am suggesting is that the claim that "we cannot simultaneously believe and inquire into a belief" (163) may not be obviously true for every kind of inquiry. I would also suggest that Woell will need to pursue the implications of his earlier, very insightful claim that "a complete account of Peirce's grades of clearness requires engagement with his theory of signs" (120); for both Peirce and James the "pragmatic elucidation" of any hypothesis is an extraordinarily complex affair. But since Woell has already made such good sense out of the pragmatism of Peirce and James, repairing the considerable damage done by other interpreters with the nuanced detail of his account, I suspect that what he intends by both of these claims is also more nuanced than my reading indicates. The proof will be in the pudding as Woell produces the companion volume. Anyone who has worked their way through the careful, illuminating analysis in this book will share my eager anticipation of the sequel.