Peirce's Empiricism: Its Roots and Its Originality

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Aaron Bruce Wilson, Peirce's Empiricism: Its Roots and Its Originality, Lexington Books, 2016, 343pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498510340.

Reviewed by Bruce Aune, University of Massachusetts Amherst


Peirce developed a comprehensive philosophical system that addressed fundamental questions about reality, mind, knowledge, and values in a critical, analytical way. Although he attempted more than once to expound the system in a unified form, he never succeeded. There has been considerable scholarly dispute about the extent to which the various parts of his system do in fact form a consistent and comprehensive whole, but Wilson believes that a sufficiently careful reading of Peirce's writings, combined with a judicious comparison of passages from different sources, supports an affirmative view. Wilson attempts to show that the resulting system, though it encompasses metaphysical as well as normative elements, will not assign an a priori status to anything: the epistemic basis for the entire system will be, in a broad but legitimate sense, wholly empirical.

The conception of experience on which Peirce founds his empiricism, though similar in many ways to that of Thomas Reid, was nevertheless distinctly his own. To show that his system deserves to be considered empiricist in spite of its individuality, Wilson devotes his first chapter to a critical survey of the history of empiricism. His survey is remarkably thorough -- more so, I believe, than his purpose actually requires. It is very interesting, however. He begins with the ancient empirici who were physicians. Unlike their competitors, the dogmatici, the empirici paid little attention to the supposed underlying causes of disease; their concern was principally directed to methods of treatment founded on trial and error. The name "empirici" is in fact traceable to a Greek verb meaning "to make trial of." Later empiricists were less concerned specifically with trial and error practice; they instead focused on endorsing only factual claims with an evidential basis in sense experience and rejecting any contention that facts about the world can be known, even in part, by what Wilson calls "some purely intellectual or a priori" capacity or condition (p. 25). Peirce himself was a particularly thoroughgoing empiricist, holding that experience is fundamental to all non-hypothetical matters of fact. He allowed that some natural knowledge is, to some degree, innate or instinctive, as it is in lower animals. However, he claimed that even this is dependent on experience, since it is subject to possible empirical falsification.

Wilson's second chapter is concerned with empiricism "without nominalism." Peirce generally had good things to say about the empiricists preceding him, but he thought all of them erred in holding some form of nominalism. He conceived of nominalism as a theory about the nature of universals, these being what is taken to be signified by general terms such as "human being" or "gorilla." Wilson introduces the competing theories as follows:

Roughly, realism says that universals exist, and are not merely mental items; conceptualism says that universals exist, but are only mental items (concepts, aabstract ideas, etc.); and nominalism says universals do not exist, and that they are only general words. (43)

Wilson's statement here is rougher than he intends: if universals do not exist, how can they be only general words, which do exist? Obviously, his last clause must be understood as meaning that nominalists regard universals simply as mere general terms -- that is, terms signifying "indifferently" individual things "of a particular sort." Holding such a view involves no inconsistency, as is often alleged, for a sort may be understood as no more than a grouping of things specified by some classificatory practice. This last way of understanding nominalism actually accords with Peirce's thinking, because, as Wilson says, Peirce regarded conceptualism as a form of nominalism. It would clearly be such a thing if the relevant mental items (the concepts or abstract ideas) were simply understood as having the signifying function of general terms. In that case, concepts would be functionally the same as certain nouns or noun phrases.

After providing some historical material on the medieval debate about universals, Wilson moves on to the development of Peirce's realism, the distinctions he drew between reality and existence, and the problems he found in nominalism. Although Peirce used the term "universals" in speaking of the medieval debate, he preferred the word "general" in reference to his own position. The idea of a general term is easy to understand: it is a verbal expression applicable to (or truly predicable of) many different things. But a "general thing" is something entirely different: it is something spoken of, not something strictly predicable of other things. Evidently, a general thing is supposed to be something somehow present in many things. Why did Peirce think such general things actually exist, or are real (that is, not dependent on any mind)? Wilson discusses a number of Peirce's arguments, none of which impresses me as convincing.

Most of the arguments Peirce used are variants of arguments in use today. I want to say something about one of Peirce's arguments that, as Wilson presents it, seems novel. Its key premise is, "Since no cognition of ours is absolutely determinate, generals must have a real existence." The relevant notions of determinacy and indeterminacy were clearly set out by Berkeley in defense of his position. As Wilson describes Berkeley's thinking, an individual horse has a specific height, a specific build, a specific color, and so on, but a general horse would be indeterminate in corresponding ways -- in its exact height, build, and color. Yet if existing things must be fully determinate in these ways, general things cannot exist. Peirce accepts Berkeley's distinction but turns his argument on its head. We can "cognize" or represent existing things. Yet if everything we cognize were determinate in every respect, we would "have the material in each such representation for an infinite amount of conscious representation, which we yet never become aware of" (Wilson, p. 63). Our minds are simply not powerful enough to represent something so determinate. The things we do represent must therefore be indeterminate in a significant way: they must be general.

The fallacy in this argument seems obvious. The fact that we can conceive of real things does not undermine Berkeley's contention that real things, unlike general things, are fully determinate. What is undermined is Peirce's evident assumption that our representation of a real thing must be as determinately detailed as the thing we represent. This assumption is wholly untenable. You might just as well say that if you see a real thing, you must be aware of every visual feature it has. A cartoon is no doubt perfectly determinate in its limited way, but what it pictures is not determinate in the same way and to the same extent. A cartoon of the U.S. President will represent a person with a determinate weight, but it will not, or at least need not, represent that weight. The cartoon can be highly schematic and contain words that, because they are semantically vague, indeterminately represent further traits that the President has or may have. The President may be said to be tall without being said to be six foot one, six foot two, or any other particular height.

Wilson continues his historical exposition in his third chapter. Here he discusses the influence of Roger Bacon, Hobbes, Descartes, Locke, and Berkeley on Peirce's thought. I was particularly interested in what he said about Peirce's criticism of Descartes' method of doubt. One of his most interesting observations was that the root of Peirce's methodological disagreement with Descartes concerned the sense of "doubt" appropriate to commendable scientific thinking. Unfortunately, Wilson did not succeed in identifying different senses of "doubt" favored by the two men; he identified different reasons that they took to be rationally sufficient for doubting something (see p. 80). But I think there is a genuine difference of meaning attached to the word "doubt" in the context of their thinking. The point occurred to me only in reading Wilson's discussion.

If I should say "I doubt that" in response to a friend's claim that P, I think she would conclude that I did not believe that P. Peirce seems to have had this way of using "doubt" in mind when he referred to Descartes' famous doubts as non-genuine, "paper" doubts. If you really doubt something in this sense, you have to think of it as untrue, or at least doubtful: you don't believe it. But Descartes didn't think of doubting this way. The aim of his method of doubt was to find certain truth, something that would be "firm and lasting" in the sciences. He was looking for axioms from which a secure system of knowledge could be deduced. What he would conclude from "I doubt that P" was not that "P" is false or dubious but that "P" is uncertain -- something that might possibly be false.

In employing his method of doubt in the Meditations, Descartes was informal and somewhat careless, supporting his claim that we do not really have certain knowledge of some things because we often make mistakes about related things (such as towers seen in the distance), a reason that he can't claim to be certain of. But in his Principles of Philosophy, he made it clear that he is operating with a conception of "perfect knowledge," in which what is known is either self-evident or provable from self-evident premises.[1] Later in that work, he also made it clear that he does not disbelieve everything he does not know in this perfect way. There is, he says, a sense of "moral certainty" that is applicable to the trustworthy beliefs we have on matters relating to the conduct of everyday life; we don't normally doubt these beliefs, "though we know that it is possible, absolutely speaking, that they may be false."[2] He illustrates this kind of certainty by the example of a letter written in Latin characters not placed in their proper Latin order. If a person attempting to read the letter takes it into his head to read B whenever he finds A and C wherever he finds B and so on (thus substituting for the letters he sees the ones following it in the alphabet) and finds that the substitutions yield a proper Latin letter, he will be convinced that he has interpreted the letter correctly, finding an alternative possibility so unlikely, if the cipher contains many words, as to seem incredible.

Descartes' conception of perfect knowledge is obviously not applicable to the well-founded opinions we form in science, or even in everyday life: Descartes' epistemic program did not work out even for his own purposes. The statistical methods developed in succeeding centuries are appropriate to Peirce's epistemic program, rather than that of Descartes. But Peirce's criticism of Descartes' method of doubt actually misrepresents Descartes' epistemic aims, and Peirce should have developed it differently. His idea that we have to start with the methods, opinions, and prejudices we actually have, and then improve them in the course of critical inquiry, is, I think, the right one to take, and it deserves to be better known. Wilson's book will be helpful for this.

Wilson's book contains five substantial chapters that I have not commented on. It is a big book and not an easy read. These other chapters cover their topics well. They are full of information, and Wilson's critical judgment is generally good. All things considered, I think it is the best, most informative book on Peirce's whole system that I have read. Unfortunately, the text is not well edited. Typos abound, there is too much repetition in the later chapters, and lengthy reference notes appear in the middle of sentences without being set off by brackets, or even parentheses (see the quotation on p. 142). It is also the only academic book I have ever read in which "who" is regularly used both for the object of a verb and the object of a preposition.

[1]Principles of Philosophy, in The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, ed. John Cottingham et al (Cambridge University Press, 1985), p. 179.

[2]Ibid, pp. 289f.