Personal Agency: The Metaphysics of Mind and Action

Placeholder book cover

E. J. Lowe, Personal Agency: The Metaphysics of Mind and Action, Oxford University Press, 2008, 222pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199217144.

Reviewed by Meghan Griffith, Davidson College


Contemporary philosophers tend to favor physicalist accounts of mind and event-causal accounts of action. In Personal Agency: The Metaphysics of Mind and Action, E. J. Lowe defends a refreshingly different view. In Part I, Lowe defends a non-Cartesian substance dualism of self and body. In Part II, he presents an account of action that is a hybrid between volitionism and agent causalism. Although much of this material originally appeared elsewhere, Lowe notes that significant changes have been made for this volume. The chapters are self-contained so that readers can select essays of particular interest.  Those who want Lowe's comprehensive view, however, will want to read the book in its entirety. There are sometimes variations in position between chapters, but these are acknowledged in the text. The book is well-argued, clearly written, thought-provoking, and original. Furthermore, Lowe presents a view that is naturalistic (on one important construal of the term) and compatible with contemporary science. The book is an excellent contribution to the literature on mind and action and should be of interest to specialists in both areas.

The book is densely packed with arguments, all of which deserve attention. I will, however, only have space to summarize the central claims and raise a few questions concerning Part II.

Part I first focuses on physical causal closure. One might expect a rejection of closure, but Lowe doesn't take this route. Instead, he looks at ways in which emergent dualism could be made consistent with plausible closure principles. Lowe discusses several principles and models, but I will outline his common themes and what I take to be his preferred method of dealing with closure.

Lowe argues that mental causes serve as unifiers and render movements non-coincidental. Mental causes thus play a crucial explanatory role, one which doesn't require a violation of closure. Current neuroscience may be able to identify a "maze of antecedent neural events" as physical causes of behavior, but it "seems to lose sight of any unifying factor explaining why those apparently independent causal chains of neural events should have converged upon the bodily movements in question" (53). As intentional states, mental states explain the coordination between what is intended and the bodily movement that ensues (28). They also explain why an event of a certain type occurred (36). Unlike physical states, intentional states are not 'blind', but have effects which closely correspond to the contents of the states themselves. And unlike physical states, intentional states are not 'directed' to a particular effect event, but to a type of event (35). This line of reasoning is developed in more detail in Chapter 5 where Lowe argues against two types of physicalism: psychoneural identity theories and 'realization' accounts. Counterfactuals are utilized to show that an intentional state (e.g., a decision) cannot be identical to or even realized by a complex neural event. This is because a decision and a complex neural event yield different counterfactual implications. At the closest world in which the decision does not occur, no bodily movement results. But at the closest world in which the complex neural event does not occur, a bodily movement of the same kind does result (103-116). Closure is not violated because mental events are not exploiting gaps in the physical (117). Intentional causation is fact causation: a decision causes it to be the case that a movement is of a certain kind (110). As fact causation, intentional causation does not compete with event causation.

Part I contains several other important arguments, which, unfortunately, I can only mention briefly. In Chapter 3, Lowe argues that the invisibility of mental causation is unsurprising and doesn't count against its existence. In Chapter 4, he argues that recent empirical work proposing the epiphenomenal status of volitions is unsuccessful because scientific investigation requires our ability to actively intervene "at will, in the course of nature" (15). And in Chapters 5 and 8 (in Part II), Lowe advances the 'unity argument' for non-Cartesian substance dualism. Lowe argues that while "I am the subject of all and only my own mental states", my body as a whole (or any part of it) could not be. Thus I am not identical to my body (96). The claim is not that the self could be disembodied or could think without any neurons. The claim is that neither my body as a whole, nor my brain as a whole, nor any subsection of my brain is "uniquely necessary for the having of all and only my thoughts" (e.g., I could have the same thoughts without my little finger, or without a particular brain cell) (170-171). This means that neither my body as a whole, nor my brain as a whole, nor any part of it is identical to me (97-99).

The picture presented in Part I can be accepted or rejected without the picture of agency in Part II, but Part I is regarded as foundational. Lowe suggests that the view of agency presented in Part II requires something close to the dualism defended in Part I.

Part II presents a unique libertarian picture of agency. Lowe claims that free choice requires genuine alternatives and lack of causal determination (157). Whereas most current libertarian views fall into one of three categories -- event-causal, agent-causal, or noncausal -- Lowe's view is somewhere in between the latter two. Like some noncausalists, Lowe posits uncaused volitions and denies that reasons are causes. Like agent causalists, Lowe argues in favor of substance causation.

Agent causalism is often criticized for reserving a special kind of causation for rational agents. Lowe avoids this with an interesting and viable suggestion -- that all causation is substance causation. On his view, there are not two distinct species of causation (event and agent). His claim is that event causation is reducible to agent causation rather than vice versa.[1] Genuine causal powers and liabilities belong only to substances. Material objects, for example, have causal powers and liabilities in the form of physical dispositions like magnetism and solubility (143). Persons are psychological substances with distinct causal powers (168). Lowe argues that an event-causal sentence, such as "the explosion caused the collapse of the bridge" is elliptical for "the bomb caused the collapse of the bridge" (5). Event causalists, of course, will argue for the opposite reduction by claiming that substances cause effects in virtue of events involving these substances. However, if one takes seriously the claim that only substances have causal powers, then one can allow the involvement of events in substance causation without conceding to the reduction in that direction. Substance causation could plausibly be characterized as an agent's acting in some manner (e.g., the bomb caused the collapse, by exploding). Acting is an event involving the agent, but it doesn't support the reduction to event causation (146).[2] According to Lowe, causing is a kind of doing. Events cannot do anything. Events can only happen and are therefore causally impotent (4, 165).

Lowe distances himself from agent causalism by asserting that agents do not cause actions. Instead, free actions are completely uncaused acts of will. Because all agents cause by acting, they cannot cause their own volitions on pain of regress (7). But agents still act as substance causes. They are the substance causes of their bodily movements, which are identified as action-results, not actions. Agents cause action-results by willing them. Although volitionism has its opponents (as Lowe is well aware) such a view arguably has advantages over traditional agent causalism. It more straightforwardly accounts for how agents cause and how they do so as any other substance does -- by acting in some manner.

My question, however, is whether these supposed advantages are worth the potential sacrifice of agential control. Noncausalist views have difficulty accounting for control. On this issue, Lowe first argues that uncaused free choices are not mere chance events. With chance events we can assign objective probabilities. We cannot do so with free choices (190-195). He then argues that an agent has control over what he chooses in virtue of his power of choice. It is incoherent, he claims, to require the agent to be 'in control' of his choice in the sense that he has control over how he exercises his power of choice (195). Exercising one's power of free choice is being in control. Thus, no further exercise of control is needed. Lowe goes on to suggest that it makes no sense for an agent (or anyone else) to be in control of his power of choice because then there would be two powers, with one dominating (and extinguishing) the other (196).

Opponents of noncausalism are unlikely to concede that uncaused choices are, by definition, exercises of control.[3] To many, the question of control seems reasonable and is not a request for a further exercise of control (contrary to what Lowe claims). Imagine the following scenario: The movement of my hands on a steering wheel controls my car's movement. It's reasonable to ask whether, in this scenario, I control the car's movements. Perhaps I do not because someone is controlling my hands. Lowe correctly notes that it is incoherent to envision one power as dominating another without extinguishing it. But the point is that we can legitimately ask whether a putative exercise of control is in fact an exercise of control, and this is plausibly what we are asking (rather than whether an actual exercise of control is controlled by a further power). In the steering example, the ability to control the car's movements is constituted by my having control over my own movements. The question for the noncausalist is whether the metaphysics of uncaused choice is sufficient to constitute control in the first place.

The final parts of the book discuss reasons for action. As uncaused acts, volitions are not even partly caused by reasons. Lowe defends an 'externalist' account of reasons for acting. A reason for acting is "some fact concerning the agent's circumstances" rather than any internal desire or belief (180). (This claim is modified later.) He argues that when desires or beliefs cause an action, one is not actually choosing in light of a belief. On Lowe's view, there is an important distinction between actions caused by desires and beliefs -- the existence of which he doesn't deny -- and those performed for a reason. The former are due to psychological forces and include cases of deviant causal chains (cases in which an agent is caused by his desires and beliefs to do something unintentionally). Lowe acknowledges that actions caused by such internal states can be reasonable, but they are not rational. Rationality, on Lowe's view, requires freely choosing to act according to a reason (175). If causes are not invoked, however, it is possible to question how one can say which among several candidate reasons for action is the one for which the agent actually acted. Lowe responds that "the reason for which the agent acted is the reason which the agent chose to act upon" (183). In the final chapter, Lowe argues that reasons for action differ from reasons for belief. He modifies the earlier claim about facts to say that while reasons for belief are facts, reasons for action are 'objective needs.' This has the advantage of explaining how there can be conflicting reasons for action. Facts, which aim at truth, cannot conflict with one another, but needs, which aim at goodness, can and do conflict (209-210). This revision, while significant, does not alter the 'externalist' claims.

Lowe makes a compelling case that causation by internal states does not constitute rationality. Does it follow, however, that such causation automatically rules it out? Maybe. I'm not sure. Even so, must we agree that rationality requires libertarian choice? Would the truth of determinism really mean that no one has ever acted rationally (but only reasonably)? Perhaps there are conceivable threats to alternatives other than internal causes (e.g., perhaps God's foreknowledge could threaten alternatives without doing so via internal causes).[4] Does any threat to alternatives rule out rationality? This view of rationality seems to require too much. It also implies that compatibilist accounts that characterize agency in terms of reasons-responsiveness fail to guarantee rationality because they do not require genuine alternatives.[5] Although many incompatibilists argue that such views fail to guarantee responsibility, it seems more difficult to argue that they similarly fail with respect to rationality.

Even if my concerns over control and rationality are well-founded (which remains to be seen of course), the view presented in Part II is illuminating, thought-provoking, and worthy of serious attention.

I'll conclude by raising a question about the relationship between the views expressed in each part. Because the two parts are, like their constituent essays, self-contained, it is not always obvious how they fit together. The substance causation of Part II accords nicely with the dualism of Part I, and there are parallel claims that mental causes do not exploit 'gaps' in physical causation (117, 177). But is there any parallel in Part II to the claim in Part I that physical (event) causation and mental (fact) causation co-exist without competition and serve to explain different things? Persons are characterized as simple psychological substances who have the power to cause bodily movements by willing them. Their causal powers are distinct from the powers of their bodies (168), even though persons have physical properties (hence the non-Cartesian label, 5). Do my intentional bodily movements involve causation by me (a psychological substance) as well as non-competing causation by parts of my body (physical substances)? Is it still possible to hold that the former explains the type of movement and the latter the particular movement? I'm not certain, but I am intrigued.

[1] Thus the event-causal claims made elsewhere in the book are to be regarded as convenient manners of speaking.

[2] The argument in the previous chapter (Chapter 6) seems somewhat different. There Lowe argues that the basic actions of animate agents provide the main (and only?) counterexample to the reductive analysis of substance causation. With inanimate objects, we can look at the means by which they caused and eventually stop the regress at an event involving the agent. With basic actions, however, the agent does not cause the effect by any means, but does so directly (126-128). Chapter 7 is where Lowe adds volitionism to his view with the upshot that we do not cause effects directly, but by willing. He admits that volitionism blocks the move made in Chapter 6 but finds volitionism to be ultimately more plausible (151-154). His settled view appears to be that all substances most likely cause by acting in some manner (7).

[3] Lowe says the relation between agent and volition is 'internal' (8). I'm not sure this resolves matters.

[4] A genuine alternative is one in which no sufficient cause exists for either outcome (188).

[5] See John Martin Fischer and Mark Ravizza, Responsibility and Control: A Theory of Moral Responsibility, Cambridge University Press, 1999.