Personal Autonomy: New Essays on Personal Autonomy and Its Role in Contemporary Moral Philosophy

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James Stacey Taylor (ed.), Personal Autonomy: New Essays on Personal Autonomy and Its Role in Contemporary Moral Philosophy, Cambridge, 2005, 350pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521837960.

Reviewed by Manuel Vargas, University of San Francisco


I once heard a colleague opine that we would be better off if there were a 50-year moratorium on philosophers using the word 'autonomy'. He went on to argue that we could get along just fine without the word, and that a good number of confusions would be dispelled along the way. This collection of new papers goes a long way toward responding to this challenge in ways that both undercut and vindicate aspects of this complaint.

Individual chapters are authored by an all-star cast of philosophers working on issues of autonomy, agency, and medical ethics. Authors include Michael Bratman, Bernard Berofsky, Robert Noggle, Al Mele, Paul Benson, Laura Waddell Ekstrom, Nomy Arpaly, Marina Oshana, Michael McKenna, Ishtiyaque Haji, Susan Wolf, John Christman, Thomas May, Tom Beauchamp, and R. G. Frey. The volume also contains a helpful introduction by the editor, James Stacey Taylor, which ably surveys many of the issues and motivations that have moved the literature over the past thirty years. The book is divided into three parts: (1) characterizations of autonomy, (2) exploration of the connections between autonomy, free will, and moral responsibility, and (3) applications and implications of various notions of autonomy. As is often the case, these divisions are at best rough guides to the contents of each part; many essays could be placed in two or even any part of the book.

There are many strengths of this volume. Its principal virtue is that it provides a detailed snapshot of contemporary philosophical work done on autonomy. It balances useful summaries or updates of the work of well-known figures with chapters that aim to advance ongoing debates. The volume clearly achieves what it sets out to do: to "represent the state of the art of the current discussion of autonomy and the roles that it plays in discussions of moral responsibility and applied philosophy" (3). The work also succeeds at providing a sense of the vibrancy of the literature, as there is substantial interaction among at least subsets of the authors, with several papers containing replies or discussions of the work of other authors in the volume, and in at least two cases, to other essays in the volume. Finally, the editor does an admirable job of providing a compelling narrative to the recent history of the philosophical work on autonomy. It is hard to imagine a more useful guide to the issues that have developed since John Christman's landmark collection of essays on autonomy.[1]

Despite the strengths of the volume, after reading through it one might justifiably wonder if there really is a unified field of philosophical work on autonomy. The diversity of essays in the volume makes a perhaps inadvertently compelling case that a number of distinct -- and at best loosely-related -- conversations share the same subject matter only in name. Autonomy is variously characterized as: bare agency; a species of self-governed agency; a kind of relation to the world; an ideal of self-control that may rarely be had; a kind of rule-governed activity that is frequently had; ownership-taking for what one does; interchangeable with freedom; a conception of morally responsible agency; neither freedom nor morally responsible agency; competence for medical decision-making; authority over personal choices; self-rule; a designation for agents bound by political principles governing the basic institutions of society; freedom from external influence; freedom from external control or restriction on choice; and, the kind of thing for which external restrictions on choice are largely irrelevant. Many, but not all, of these characterizations can be rendered consistent with one another. This is, of course, not an objection to the work of any particular author or even the volume itself. It is only to observe that if autonomy is one thing it is protean.

The fluidity of the concept leaks out in the introduction and throughout various subsequent chapters. For example, Taylor rightly notes that one should resist the temptation to collapse discussions of autonomy and of moral responsibility (17). Nevertheless, Taylor and others in this volume sometimes have difficulty respecting this constraint, especially when it comes to Harry Frankfurt's enormously influential work. Throughout the volume, Frankfurt's work on agency (especially the account offered in "Freedom of the Will and the Concept of a Person"[2]) is treated as perhaps the locus classicus of autonomy theories. While it is true that there are aspects of Frankfurt's work, especially his later work, that suggest that he is less interested in free will and moral responsibility than he is in some notion of self-regulated agency, it is hardly obvious that the Frankfurt of "Freedom of the Will and the Concept of a Person" was very much concerned with autonomy. Indeed, as far as I can tell, the word 'autonomy' does not even appear in his early work, in contrast to Gerald Dworkin's work, which made use of many similar ideas but was explicitly concerned with autonomy.

Irrespective of Frankfurt's initial aims, it is clear that his work has had a profound impact on contemporary theorizing about autonomy. Frankfurt is the most commonly indexed entry in the volume; citations to him and his work outstrip citations to Aristotle, Kant, Michael Bratman, Christine Korsgaard, Al Mele, J. David Velleman, and Susan Wolf combined. Clearly, a good deal of the work in this volume is operating with Frankfurt as part of the background of concerns that animate various proposals about autonomy. So, if we were to substitute another term for one strand of the autonomy literature, "Frankfurt studies" might be an entirely appropriate candidate.

There are other threads of discussion less centrally indebted or responsive to Frankfurt's work -- which is not to say that Frankfurt's influence is altogether absent in them. For example there are accounts of autonomy tied to political philosophy (Benson, Christman) and to bioethics (Arpaly, Beauchamp, and May). These discussions each seem to reflect a distinctive set of concerns, less abstract in their motivation than the Frankfurt-style literature and more clearly practical in their theoretical aims. Since these discussions each seem somewhat independent from one another, we might suppose that in fact there are at least three principal subject matters with some claim to autonomy as a description or title. It might therefore be useful to distinguish between Agential Autonomy (of which the Frankfurt-responsive work is most prominent), Individual Political Autonomy (or any notion of autonomy explicitly tied to social and political aims), and Minimal Medical Autonomy (notions of autonomy relevant to competence in medical decision making). There are, plausibly, interesting connections between these notions. Distinguishing them, however, might make it clearer that the various autonomy literatures are not necessarily closely related in their content, conceptual roles, or theoretical aims.

Detailed discussions of the individual chapters of this volume are beyond the scope of this review, but it may be useful to remark on some of the more frequently recurring themes and issues in the volume. Perhaps the most complex of these concerns is something I already mentioned -- the relationship between some notion of autonomy (often, but not always tied to Frankfurt's work) and morally responsible agency. Many authors (e.g., Berofsky, Bratman, Ekstrom, Haji, McKenna, and Oshana) are careful to distinguish their account of autonomy from an account of free and/or morally responsible agency. A worry about this distinction, though, is that it is not always clear what intuitions, if any, are anchoring the proposed accounts of autonomy. Arpaly puts the concern this way:

Moral responsibility and the limits of permissible paternalism are subjects about which we have plenty of pretheoretical intuitions, however disorderly they may be … . Divorcing discussions of autonomy from these pretheoretical intuitions makes it more of a challenge to remain clear on the question of what, exactly, we are discussing and debating when we are discussing and debating autonomy or identification. (176)

Christman similarly emphasizes the idea that we cannot test particular cases against purported intuitions about autonomy until we know what work we expect a theory of autonomy to be doing (282). One explanation of why autonomy intuitions are comparatively unreliable in the context of theory-building is offered by McKenna:

autonomous agency seems almost exclusively a term of art largely unrecognized outside of philosophical discourse. While it is nearly impossible to pick up the Sunday paper and find an article devoted to the autonomy of some agent's conduct, it is by contrast almost impossible to pick up the Sunday paper and not be struck by an article devoted to why some agent is responsible for something or other. (206)

If Arpaly, Christman, and McKenna are right, then theorizing about autonomy -- whatever the sense -- must proceed very carefully. To their credit, most of the authors in this volume provide some motivation for being concerned with the particular notion of autonomy with which each is concerned, e.g., salubrious psychology, the kind of agents relevant to basic social or political norms, exploration of the purportedly intuitive idea between internal and external sources of action, and so on. Many of the chapters begin with some announcement that autonomy is central to contemporary moral thinking, or that we should want to understand the nature of our agency, or that we have some ideal of self-control that it would be good to explicate. Granting the truth of these pronouncements, it is not clear that these answers constitute adequate replies. What is needed are concepts, purposes, or values sufficiently robust in their content and commitments to anchor our evaluations of the proposals that follow. That is, without a more robust set of linguistic or conceptual intuitions by which we can test proposed theories, or better stipulation of what the aims of a theory of autonomy might be, we are in a poor position to evaluate whether a given account of autonomy is adequate by even its own lights.

Another recurring theme in the volume concerns the extent to which autonomy is to be understood as, roughly, an intrinsic or extrinsic property of agents (see the chapters by Berofsky, Haji, McKenna, and Oshana). On the former, autonomy is treated as something that is settled entirely by, for example, a particular configuration of mental attitudes. On the latter, any configuration of mental attitudes will need to be supplemented by some facts about the world, either (1) some suitably broad range of options, (2) a non-deviant connection between the world and the requisite attitudes, and/or (3) some arrangements of facts about the world that permit the agent's actions to be efficacious. To be sure, there is room for mixed and scalar approaches here. The relevant issue, though, concerns whether and how an agent must be related to the world for that agent to be autonomous. Again, it is hard to see how bare intuitions about autonomy simpliciter would be useful for sorting out this issue. And again, it seems that what is needed is a clear sense of what work a theory of autonomy is supposed to do or, at least, we need some link to a more robust set of intuitions to adjudicate the matter.

Relatedly, in several places, authors discuss whether and to what extent an account of autonomy must take on substantive normative commitments (e.g., in chapters by Benson, Christman, and to some extent Wolf). This issue is important for a number of reasons. First, it is relevant to debates that link autonomy to various social and political aims, because it speaks to the extent to which a given notion of autonomy is dependent upon or reflective of a comprehensive moral doctrine, in the Rawlsian sense. In turn, this affects how autonomy is viewed internal to various moral and political frameworks. Second, the extent to which an autonomous individual must have particular normative content is relevant when evaluating the adequacy of various "content-neutral" accounts, i.e., accounts that emphasize agential or social structures without specification of their content.[3] As in the prior case, views about autonomy's conceptual role are salient in determining how to evaluate this issue.

This volume covers a considerable amount of ground, but no collection can hope to include every possible figure or position relevant to a debate. Two notable absences may say something important about the state of the literature. First, apparently by design, the volume contains no attempts to articulate, survey, or provide an account of autonomy centrally within a broadly Kantian or neo-Kantian framework. Kantian impulses are reflected in a number of chapters, but there is no attempt to provide a systematically Kantian-influenced treatment of autonomy. On the one hand this is surprising, given the role of autonomy in Kant's own work and the rehabilitation of Kantian ethics over the past few decades. On the other hand, it may simply reflect a kind of schism in the conversations between those operating within a broadly Kantian framework and those outside of that framework. Still, it would have been beneficial to see at least one essay that articulates a Kantian account of autonomy.

A second, somewhat less surprising absence is the exploration or defense of a view that denies the existence or possibility of autonomy. Indeed, a number of essays (e.g., McKenna, Beauchamp) proceed on the explicit assumption that autonomy is the kind of thing that people at least sometimes possess. The absence of a "no autonomy" view is interesting because broadly skeptical or eliminativist views have been important in several neighboring fields, including ethics, free will, and philosophy of mind. Perhaps the absence of this sort of view will be remedied in time, as the conceptual space surrounding autonomy becomes more heavily populated. My suspicion, though, is that this will not happen any time soon because of three widespread convictions in the various literatures on autonomy: (1) recognition of the inevitable social constitution of aspects of one's own agency (Oshana, Christman, et. al.) (2) the view that any desire we have for self-creation needs to acknowledge constraints of plausibility (see Berofsky, Noggle, et. al.), and (3) a sense that at least for Political Autonomy and Minimal Medical Autonomy there is comparatively clear and identifiable practical work for these concepts that speaks in favor of their ongoing usage.[4]

The afore-mentioned concerns about the coverage of the volume are minor things, and as I noted, they may reflect more about the literature than any failing of the volume itself. Indeed, although the contents of the book are not especially unified, it is clear that the volume as a whole is indispensable for anyone interested in contemporary philosophical work on the various notions of autonomy. The individual essays are generally excellent and deserving of careful study. For the foreseeable future, this volume will surely be the gateway text for serious philosophical study of the many faces of autonomy.

[1] Christman, John, ed. The Inner Citadel: Essays on Individual Autonomy, Oxford University Press, 1989.

[2] Journal of Philosophy 68, no. 1 (1971): 5-20.

[3] Frankfurt is often treated as providing a paradigmatic statement of this sort of view, where what matters is the structure of an agent's desires without specific regard to the content of those desires.

[4] This issue may be one where at least the free will debate -- lurking in the background of many of these discussions of autonomy -- can learn something from the autonomy literature. There are those who think free will requires a capacity for robust self-creation of an impossible sort. There are also those who think that free will requires a not necessarily incoherent, but nevertheless unlikely, form of "ultimacy" or "sourcehood." Rather than concluding that we lack free will because we do not likely have these powers, we might instead follow autonomy theorists in acknowledging that we are always already socially embedded beings, that the impetus to demand self-creation of ourselves must be tempered by a realistic conception of our powers, and that there are clear practical uses for our concepts of freedom and moral responsibility that make skeptical or eliminativist views nonstarters. Instead of taking the implausibility of any given conception of ultimacy or source-hood as a reason to think that free will does not exist, perhaps we should instead think of recognition of this limitation as a constraint on any credible account of free will.