Perspectives on Ignorance from Moral and Social Philosophy

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Rik Peels (ed.), Perspectives on Ignorance from Moral and Social Philosophy, Routledge, 2017, 246pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138945661.

Reviewed by Chad Flanders, Saint Louis University School of Law


The blurb for this book says that ignorance in moral and social philosophy is "undertheorized" in contemporary analytic philosophy. This has the air of a paradox -- can we really know more about what we don't know? -- but is no more paradoxical than saying we need to think more about the category of the "unthinkable," or that we need to be more skeptical about "skepticism." What the blurb invites, though, is a question about what it is about ignorance that needs to be more "theorized." Ignorance comes up in a variety of discrete contexts, e.g., in law and ethics and epistemology. Is there something about the idea of ignorance that is worth sustained treatment in its own right, separate and apart from when it variously comes up in these different areas?

Maybe, although this volume at times struggles to show what it is. There are thirteen essays here (including the introduction) and they do not betray a unity of approach or even a shared understanding of what "ignorance" is. Some of the essays seem, deep down, not really to be about ignorance at all, but rather about moral responsibility (those by Carolina Sartorio and Elinor Mason), or about decision-making under uncertainty (those by Martin Peterson and Sven Ove Hansson). Essays by Marcia Baron and Larry Alexander on whether and when ignorance can justify or excuse bad behavior are of the authors' usual high quality, but they do not have the feel of breaking new ground. Nonetheless, there are two themes that emerge in the course of several of the chapters, which show why ignorance is a topic that repays study and attention.

The first theme, that of how and whether one might be responsible for acts done out of ignorance, emerges in the two excellent essays by Michael J. Zimmerman and Holly M. Smith, which are usefully placed back-to-back. Zimmerman, building on arguments he has made previously but adapting them to the theme of the volume, develops what he calls the "origination thesis," which holds that if one is culpable for an act done in ignorance, this act must have as its origin "some item of behavior for which one is directly culpable and which was an instance of willing wrongdoing" (p. 83). Zimmerman ably defends the thesis against objections, dealing most effectively and interestingly with "attributionism," or the view that agents are morally responsible for whatever "expresses . . . who they are as a person" (p. 88).

Zimmerman rejects attributionism as giving us a good theory of responsibility, as opposed to a theory of blameworthiness. "I am quite willing to admit that the mere possession of a morally objectionable trait renders one blameworthy for its possession," he writes, and so is "in this regard fully in agreement with attributionists." But Zimmerman denies that one can hold someone responsible in any strong sense for a morally objectionable trait (and the actions that flow from it) if that trait does not have its origin in willing wrongdoing. In a suggestive coda to his essay, Zimmerman highlights that he means the origination thesis to apply especially to the question of fair punishment rather than questions of responsibility more generally. Anyone who is concerned with the justification of punishment needs to wrestle with Zimmerman's concluding provocation -- either by coming up with an alternative to the origination thesis or (what I would tend to prefer) looking at punishment as less about holding people responsible in any deep way and more about securing some other social good.

Smith's essay deals with cases of "culpable ignorance," specifically, where one performs a wrong act out of ignorance and one is to blame for having become ignorant in the first place. Smith, revising an earlier view of hers, concludes that agents who act in culpable ignorance are not to blame for the act done out of ignorance, although they are responsible for "the earlier dereliction that led to that act" (p. 95). This is a somewhat counterintuitive claim, as I think we find ourselves believing that people are blameworthy both for their original act of, say, failing to pay attention in CPR class (Smith's example) and for the failure to apply the correct techniques to a choking victim because of earlier inattention. Smith quite rightly notes the connections between her topic and moral luck, and sketches out -- in an extremely helpful table -- how luck might (or might not) bear on how we view the blameworthiness of culpably ignorant actors.

I find Smith's essay overall very persuasive, but still find it intuitively plausible that a person who is culpably ignorant is also responsible for harmful acts done out of that ignorance. I wonder whether, even if we hold a person only blameworthy for the original act of becoming ignorant but not for the bad acts that spring forth from that ignorance, there might be room for the idea that the person who causes harm from ignorance is still a morally worse person than the person who is ignorant, but causes no harm, even though they are both equally blameworthy (because they are both only to blame for becoming ignorant). Perhaps here we might turn again to attributivism, not as a full-on theory of responsibility, but for blameworthiness of agents, and draw a distinction between the moral worth of different agents on those grounds. Or perhaps, given the resultant harm (or even the potential risk of harm), it could be that some agents' acts of culpable ignorance are in fact much worse than others -- even though they are in fact only responsible for that original ignorance.

The second theme in the book is more inchoate, but present in the diverse essays of Don Fallis, Alexander A. Guerrero, and Seumas Miller. All of these chapters deal in one way or another with the social and political dimensions of ignorance, and take on a greater significance in our current political climate, where (it is commonly argued) citizens are voting not based on any firm knowledge but out of ignorance.[1] Fallis's essay usefully equates making people ignorant as on a par with deceiving people -- and this seems right, as deliberately keeping people "in the dark," can be just as effective, and sometimes more so, than simply lying outright to them. Guerrero takes on the question of how to assess experts given that one cannot simply evaluate them on one's own -- after all, that is why they are experts, and we are not. Finally, Miller considers the interesting possibility of "collective ignorance."

Again, the theme that emerges from these essays isn't as clear as in the Smith and Zimmerman essays, but it might be put something along these lines: in modern society, and especially in contemporary democracies, knowledge is at a premium, and it is especially important that knowledge is widely distributed, because it is the people as a whole who are the ultimate decision-makers. But much of that knowledge is -- because of its complexity -- something only experts can have; moreover, there are some forces that actively want to keep a lot of people ignorant. Thus, we have problems of "collective ignorance" that threaten well-informed collective decision-making. Put this way, the issue of ignorance becomes both promising as an avenue of theoretical investigation and more pressing than ever. If, as Rik Peels emphasizes in his useful introduction, the study of ignorance in its infancy, here is a place where there is room to grow. As it is, this volume takes some first, sometimes halting, steps towards showing ignorance as uniquely relevant to classic debates in analytic philosophy (e.g., moral responsibility) but also to some real and relatively recent challenges that are facing modern democracies.

[1] See.,e.g., Jason Brennan, "Trump Won Because Voters Are Ignorant, Literally," Foreign Policy (November 10, 2016).