Perspectives on Social Ontology and Social Cognition

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Mattia Gallotti and John Michael (eds.), Perspectives on Social Ontology and Social Cognition, Springer, 2014, 189pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789401791465.

Reviewed by Paul A. Roth, University of California, Santa Cruz


It would be difficult to overstate the quantity of literature spawned by work on social ontology over the last two decades. Yet debates on this topic generated especially by John Searle's writings recall for those familiar with longer-term controversies and trends within the philosophy of social science a once central but now largely forgotten debate about rationality inspired by Peter Winch's The Idea of a Social Science and its adamant anti-scientism (1958). And although Searle in particular claims to be a naturalist, all the major theoretical work on social ontology and collective intentionality proves relentlessly conceptual and so difficult to relate to empirical social science. Like Winch's work, the analyses in this area claim to identify necessary elements of social reality and yet do not offer any apparent possibility of empirical exploration of those claims.

Winch's work dominated discussion within the philosophy of social science while passing largely unnoticed outside that domain. Controversy surrounding Winch finds its canonical instantiation in Bryan Wilson's anthology, Rationality (1970). Those cognizant of the ever- burgeoning literature on social ontology and collective intentionality might thus long for a volume like Wilson's, in this case one that would crystalize the core philosophical and related empirical issues that emerge from the voluminous writings. The book under review is not that volume.

Although Searle does not work alone in this area (featured players also include Michael Bratman, Margaret Gilbert, and Raimo Tuomela), only Searle contributes to this volume (including a Q&A with the editors). For that reason one might anticipate that the included papers respond in one way or another to Searle's work. But as detailed below, that expectation turns out not at all to be the case.

The title's promise of perspectives on social ontology and social cognition yields only an oddly bifurcated volume. The book contains twelve essays. Editors Mattia Gallotti and John Michael weigh in with an introductory overview that offers capsule summaries of each subsequent essay. The editors subdivide the contributions into Part I: Perspectives on Social Ontology and Part II: Perspectives on Social Cognition. Factoring out the editors' introduction and Searle's rehash of his position, that leaves 10 essays, five that fill out Part I, and five that constitute Part II. On the one hand, and as discussed below, readers expecting to find any sustained discussion of Searle's work at the conceptual or the empirical level will be mostly disappointed. On the other hand, readers with no particular interest in Searle but hoping to find how empirical research on social cognition intersects with the extensive philosophical literature on collective intentionality and social ontology will be disappointed as well. And while some of the individual chapters prove to be of genuine interest, the volume lacks any real cohesion. Its essays do not clearly or consistently address a common theme.

Gallotti and Michael intimate that the connection between the two parts should be as follows:

far from severing the link between social ontology and social cognition research, proposals that relativize the role of intentions in creating, sustaining, and/or constituting the social-institutional reality in fact open up a diverse array of subtle questions about how social cognition and social ontology might be interrelated. (2)

Given the pride of place accorded to Searle and critical (and I do mean critical) discussions of his work in some of the essays in Part I, one might expect that the essays addressed to questions of empirical research found in Part II would also take Searle's work (or its near rivals) as their focus. Here the volume comes apart in a vivid and yet revealing fashion.

To begin at the end, the twelfth essay -- "Social Cognition as Causal Inference: Implications for Common Knowledge and Autism" by Jakob Hohway and Colin Palmer -- never mentions Searle or any related work. It offers an analysis of autism spectrum disorder (ASD) that owes more to game theory than it does to any work on collective intentionality by those thinkers mentioned earlier in this review. The authors of this essay summarize their position as follows: "We have used ASD as a test case to bring out how basic, simple differences in the optimisation of expectations of the precision of sensory input could challenge common knowledge and thereby social cognition in ASD." (186) So while tangentially related to general questions of social cognition, the fit with the other contributions to this volume proves quite unclear.

The other four essays in Part II do in fact cite at least one work by Searle in their bibliographies. But one looks in vain to any of these essays for insight regarding whether or how Searle's supposedly naturalistic line on social ontology (or any other, for that matter) interfaces with the questions pursued by the empirical research rehearsed and reviewed in Part II. Chapter 11, "Perceiving Affordances and Social Cognition" by Anika Fiebich promises to forge a link between a Gibsonian account of social affordances and "the role of social cognition for the perception of ecological affordances in social and institutional contexts." (149) This she further divides into what she terms broad and narrow senses of social cognition. Yet only the narrow sense receives any fleshed out discussion in terms of empirical research. Searle's work (and indeed all related work on collective intentionality) finds its place in the broad sense of that term, i.e., as it relates to social or institutional contexts. (159) Unfortunately however, precisely this broad sense never ties into her discussion of any of the empirical work. Thus while she announces that she follows Searle on collective recognition, this claim enters her account as an obiter dictum and not as a demonstrated research result.

Attention to work on collective intentionality as a guide to or as informing empirical research dwindles even further in the remaining essays in this section. Ch. 8, "Constraints on Joint Action" by Cédric Paternotte, finds the sole appearance of this topic emerging in the following remark: "Overall, the apparent incommensurability of competing definitions has caused a somewhat palpable paralysis of the field, currently stuck under the shadow of the 'big four' (Bratman, Gilbert, Searle, Tuomela -- the 'classical definitions/accounts')" (104). Paternotte observes in his concluding remarks that "Definitions of joint action are too semantic and not susceptible enough to objective comparison and assessment. The paper [i.e., Paternotte's] has studied several possible constraints for them." (121) Ch. 9, "How Objects Become Social in the Brain: Five Questions for a Neuroscience of Social Reality" by Cristina Becchio and Cesare Bertone is brief (6 pages, excluding references), and its length still greatly exceeds its intellectual substance. But as the title promises, the authors do sketch five questions. Ch. 10, "Materializing Mind: The Role of Objects in Cognition and Culture" by Kristian Tylén and John J. McGraw, mentions Searle just once, and the reference proves gratuitous given the actual content of the article. These authors focus more on the "extended mind" hypothesis, concluding "that through cultural practices the stable, 'manipulable', and public properties of objects have come to afford unprecedented modes of extended and distributed cognition." (135) The essay will most likely prove informative to researchers in social cognition who wish to learn about some philosophical background as opposed to philosophers who work in the field.

Five of the essays in Part I however do offer insights to those with philosophical interests in questions regarding collective intentionality and social ontology. Ch. 3, "Deflating Socially Constructed Objects: What Thoughts Do to the World," by Ruth Garrett Millikan presents a clear and insightful extension by Millikan of her well-known form of naturalism to Searlean topics. Although this essay draws exclusively from already published work, it nonetheless provides a crisp and integrated articulation of a position too often overlooked in this debate and one that yet has clear and direct relevance to it. Much discussion in the essay -- the "deflationary" bit -- addresses how a thin, naturalistic notion of convention does the work of explaining social coordination without requiring any inflation of social ontology or appeal to collective intentionality. Indeed, one can only be struck by the striking absence of wider discussion of Millikan's work by those typically orchestrating surveys of the usual suspects in this area. I suspect this lacuna signals how faux naturalisms trump interest in the writings of someone who develops naturalism with full philosophical seriousness.

Brian Epstein contributes Ch. 4, "How Many Kinds of Glue Hold the Social World Together?" The article functions as a précis for a forthcoming book that develops an alternative to, inter alia, Searle and Millikan regarding the generation and maintenance of social kinds. Epstein terms these "anchoring schemas." As he puts it, "In considering contexts of anchoring, that is, we are concerned with the facts in virtue of which a social property is set up to be the particular universal tool it is, to be applied in any range of contexts of instantiation." (47) With respect to this volume, the most germane point concerns the fact that Epstein directs the overwhelming bulk of his attention to Millikan's work on "social glue." And he looks to primarily modify her view, not to reject it. Searle receives one brief mention at the outset of the essay. In the last paragraph, Epstein writes apropos of the usual positions found on this subject, "Slogans like . . . 'for something to be a social object, it must be created with some functional intention in mind,' are widely repeated. But they are frankly incredible, given the immense diversity of the social world and the scanty understanding we have of it." (54) Amen.

Like Epstein's essay, Francesco Guala's Ch. 5 essay, "On the Nature of Social Kinds" uses Searle's work only in passing and as a foil for developing his own realist account of social kinds. Guala lumps Searle together with some unlikely company -- Barry Barnes, David Ruben, and Ian Hacking -- as all holding what Guala labels the "Difference thesis": "unlike natural kinds, social kinds depend crucially on our attitudes toward them." (58) While quite unconvinced by Guala's suggestion that all the thinkers named subscribe to this thesis, that worry proves of less moment than Guala's general claim that "collective attitudes are unnecessary for kindhood." (60) Guala terms his position 'realist' because of this. People can be uniformly wrong in their beliefs about a social kind, and yet the kind exists. Indeed, Guala maintains that "collective acceptance, belief, or recognition" turn out to be "neither necessary nor sufficient for the existence of the [social] kind itself." (67) Guala, well known for his work in philosophy of economics, draws on accounts of coordination that swing free of any essential appeal to propositional attitudes. So while he offers a rather different account than does Millikan, his view like hers provides an ontologically starker alternative to the usual accounts found in discussions of social kinds.

The final two essays in Part I are those by Enrico Terrone and Daniela Tagliafico, "Normativity of the Background: A Contextualist Account of Social Facts" (Ch. 6) and Edouard Machery (Ch. 7), "Social Ontology and the Objection from Reification." Both engage directly in critical, thoughtful, and important ways with issues internal to Searle's thought. Terrone and Tagliafico develop a very specific criticism of and modification to Searle's position concerning what Searle terms "the Background." For Searle, this term serves as shorthand signaling "a set of capacities supporting the whole apparatus of status functions, intentionality, and speech acts." (69) Against Searle, these authors claim that while

in Searle's discourse, the Background comes after the fact, when the social reality is already constructed. By contrast, this chapter argues that in order to explain what a social fact is, the Background should take part in the formula that summarizes the establishment of the status function. (69)

This is no small point. Much of the essay's analysis rehearses differing and ultimately non-reconcilable formulations of the Background promulgated by Searle in work between 1995 and 2010. Regarding a key issue of how Searle's self-proclaimed naturalism intersects with actual empirical work, the author's express their important take-home conclusion as follows: "Searle's social ontology is unstable between a Platonist account, whereby status functions are self-standing abstract structures that can be instantiated in concrete contexts, and a naturalistic account, whereby there are no genuine status functions without a context." (81) Reviewers of Searle's books have long complained about precisely this tension between a professed naturalism and an ingrained idealism in Searle's social theory, and have detailed related inabilities to resolve it in terms that Searle could accept. This essay yields yet one more instance of a fundamental tension residing at the heart of the Searlean project.

Machery argues against Searle "that an important and well-established finding about how people conceive of their social world -- which sociologists and psychologists call 'reification' -- is incompatible with Searle's proposal about the mode of existence of social entities as well as with similar views." (88) Alone among the essays in this volume, Machery measures Searle's alleged naturalism against specific research findings and finds it wanting. 'Reification' as Machery deploys the term "occurs when a social entity is taken to be a natural one." (89) Not too surprisingly (as Machery notes), studies can be readily found that establish that "in many cultures, many people reify many social phenomena." (92) But if people reify social kinds, then they do not consider themselves the authors of the existence of those kinds. The research that he cites about reification entails this as a consequence. Machery then argues that this result saddles Searle with an inconsistency. Searle claims that a social entity exists "if and only if people collectively recognize its status function," (93) and yet evidence shows that some social entities exist without any such recognition of their status function. Given a choice between which of these propositions to reject -- Searle's a priori definition of status functions or the evidence-supported claim about reification -- Machery reasonably concludes that the former must go. But Machery does not stop here. He then canvasses various ways in which Searle might respond to this problem as well as weakened formulations of Searle's thesis that would resolve the incompatibility. None work, or so Machery argues.

Most importantly, the essays in the volume under review only serve to underline either fundamental conceptual problems with Searle's work, the deep disconnect between Searle's account and empirical research in the field, or in general the ways in which others working in a more rigorously naturalist vein sidestep or by-pass this entire line of theoretical work. A related oddity concerns a complete lack of mention in any essay of work by Paul Thagard, who has written extensively and influentially on how to connect social epistemology and empirical research. The absence of an index also hampers readers looking for interconnections among the essays. The volume's unwitting highlighting of pervasive disconnects between theoretical and empirical work on social ontology may well be its most significant contribution to the literature.