Peter of Spain: Summaries of Logic: Text, Translation, Introduction, and Notes

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Brian P. Copenhaver with Calvin G. Normore and Terence Parsons, Peter of Spain: Summaries of LogicText, Translation, Introduction, and Notes, Oxford University Press, 2014, 547pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199669585.

Reviewed by E. Jennifer Ashworth, University of Waterloo


This new version of Peter of Spain's Summaries of Logic is one of the most exciting contributions to the history of medieval logic in recent years, not because it presents any dramatic discoveries, but because it introduces an important work to a public wider than that of dedicated scholars able to read Latin. It contains not only a slightly emended version of the landmark edition of the Latin text produced by L. M. de Rijk in 1972, but also an accurate and readable translation of that text, together with a substantial introduction and even more substantial footnotes that place Peter in the context of his predecessors and contemporaries, as well as explaining his doctrines. There have, of course, been previous attempts to render Peter of Spain in English, but some preceded the critical edition and subsequent scholarly work, while others translated only extracts from the critical edition, or were unfortunately too inaccurate to be useful.

Peter of Spain is perhaps the best-known medieval logician, even if some later authors, notably John Buridan, were better logicians. All students at medieval universities had to study logic, and Peter's Summaries of Logic seems to have been the most widely used textbook, though it should be noted that university statutes sometimes specified only selected parts of it, and that the text itself was sometimes altered or rearranged. Despite the rapid decline of medieval logic after around 1530, the Summaries continued to be published throughout the sixteenth century along with various commentaries, and the last edition I have seen in person was printed in Cologne in 1622, accompanied by the popular commentary by the late fifteenth-century Parisian, John Versor. Despite Peter's fame, however, his actual identity is far more obscure. For a long time he was identified as Pope John XXI, who died in 1277 (and is still so identified in library catalogues), but recent research by Angel d'Ors shows that Peter was no pope, but rather a member of the Dominican order active in southern France and northern Spain, who probably wrote in the second quarter of the thirteenth century. Short of new evidence, this is as far as one can go in identifying him, even if we can be sure that he was indeed called Peter.

In his Summaries, Peter started from a standard Aristotelian framework, though the reader should bear in mind that even this was somewhat novel, given that of Aristotle's Organon only the Categories and On Interpretation, along with Porphyry's Isagoge or Introduction to Aristotle's Categories had been available in the Latin-speaking West before the twelfth century. During the twelfth century the Prior Analytics, Topics, and Sophistical Refutations also became available, with the Posterior Analytics, the most difficult of Aristotle's logical works, being the last to arrive; and in the thirteenth century this material provided a ready-made curriculum for logical study at the newly founded universities of Western Europe. Peter's Summaries cover the Aristotelian material, with the exception of the Posterior Analytics, in Chapters 1 to 5 and Chapter 7. This does not mean, of course, that Peter followed Aristotle slavishly in these chapters. For example, 'Chapter 1: On Introductions' introduces new material about the nature of language and its signification; 'Chapter 4: Syllogisms' organizes Aristotelian categorical syllogistic for the classroom; and 'Chapter 7: Fallacies', which takes up no less than 47% of the entire work, contains a large number of sophismata, the puzzle-sentences intended to draw attention to difficulties and weaknesses arising from different interpretations of logical definitions and rules, and whose solution demanded the introduction of careful distinctions. The sophismata discussed by Peter were found in many contemporary sources, as is shown by Sten Ebbesen and Frédéric Goubier's A Catalogue of 13th-Century Sophismata (Paris: Vrin, 2010), a valuable reference work not listed by Brian Copenhaver.

In the remaining chapters of the Summaries Peter introduced material that had no direct Aristotelian origin, and whose development had begun in the twelfth century. Chapter 6 is devoted to supposition theory, and related material on such topics as appellation and ampliation is dealt with in Chapters 8 to 12. Peter seems to have placed supposition theory before the treatment of fallacies because it could be used to explain how to avoid defective arguments, but later commentators such as Lambertus de Monte (in conjunction with other Cologne masters) and John Versor moved it to after the discussion of fallacies, and presented the last six chapters under the general heading of Parva logicalia. Roughly speaking, these 'little logicals' deal with a theory of reference or 'standing for'. That is, they tell us how to analyze the type and range of things that the subject terms of propositions stand for in the light of the predicates, tensed verbs, and syncategorematic terms such as 'every', 'some', and 'none', that constitute each proposition. Thus, 'horse' in "horse is a species" stands for a common nature, 'horse' in "Every horse is brown" stands for every individual horse, and "Some horse was in the field" stands for at least one past horse, while leaving it open whether that horse (and its fellows, if any) still exists. Once the analysis has taken place, it is possible to assess the truth-conditions of the statement in question and its role in argumentation.

As is shown by the number of chapters devoted to supposition theory and its ramifications, along with the very lengthy chapter devoted to fallacies, the picture of logic that we get from Peter's Summaries is not at all the same as the one we would get from a twenty-first century textbook. Peter had very little to say about purely formal matters. He made only passing reference to propositional connectives, and conditional inferences are mainly discussed in connection with various forms of the fallacy of affirming the consequent. His presentation of the categorical syllogism is very brief, occupying only 4% of the Summaries, and is generally clear. Nonetheless, the present-day reader who is acquainted with the syllogism as it is usually presented today will be puzzled by two things that are left unexplained in the introduction and notes, namely the listing of only three figures, and the presence of so-called indirect modes, which are said to have the major term as the subject of the conclusion rather than as the predicate. These features stem from the standard medieval definition of the major term as the one that appears with the middle term in the first premise, and it was only in the sixteenth century that the definition of the major term as the predicate of the conclusion became popular. In the light of this latter definition, indirect modes had to be discarded, and at the same time the fourth figure gradually became more acceptable to logicians, since its modes could no longer be seen as merely variants of the indirect modes of the first figure.

Given that the bulk of Peter's discussion involves problems of language, and how these relate to finding flaws in argumentation, it is important for the explanatory material to be based on a detailed grasp of thirteenth-century views. It is here that the touch of the authors is less sure. This is shown by the bibliography, which contains only one early work by Irène Rosier-Catach, to mention just one example. It is also shown by the translation. One example is the use of 'conventional' for 'ad placitum' (though this is unfortunately widespread in the literature). According to medieval logicians, utterances were given their signification by an original impositor (often said to be Adam) at his pleasure, and only if others followed him was a convention established. Thus 'secundum placitum imponentis' means 'according to the pleasure of the impositor' and not 'by conventional imposition' (p. 295). Another example is the translation of 'per prius et posterius', which was an established technical phrase applied to terms used in an extended or analogical sense. This is sometimes translated correctly as 'said primarily and secondarily', but on p. 261 we find the very odd translation 'is used . . . regarding what is primary and secondary'.

A more important example, that affects both the introductory discussion and the translation, has to do with the notion of univocation. In the introduction (p. 65) the authors make the mistaken suggestion that in his discussion of a problem to do with the reference of a relative term, Peter may have been referring to the fallacy of univocation as discussed in the twelfth century. That fallacy arose from a remark by Boethius, related to the fact that Latin does not have an indefinite article, to the effect that "man runs" and "man does not run" do not form a contradiction if the first occurrence of 'man' refers to an individual and the second refers to the species. It was believed that that kind of double reference did not produce equivocation, and hence any fallacious argument that arose from it concerned univocation. This kind of fallacy was solved in the thirteenth century by appeal to the new theory of supposition, rather than to the doctrine of signification, and found its home among the fallacies of figure of expression or of accident, as it does in Peter's Summaries (pp. 245, 355, 357). On p. 65 the translators also refer to what they call Peter's foggy and unusual language when he says 'in univocante', and 'univoca univocantur'. In fact, Peter is using a distinction that originated in the twelfth century between univocals as the things that are univocated and as the words that do the univocating. Thus horses and dogs are made univocated things when they are referred to by the univocating word 'animal'. Exactly similar distinctions were applied to equivocals by Abelard and others. These moves make sense of the common claim, mentioned on p. 65 and p. 431, that "anything univocal can be equivocal." This is true of things because some things such as dogs are univocal under the name 'animal' and equivocal under the name 'dog'. With respect to univocal things, it should also be noted that on p. 197, line two, the rendering of Boethius's translation of Aristotle should read "univocals are things whose name is common," as this was the standard interpretation of that remark.

So far as the translation in general is concerned, it is important to realize that the translators have tried to produce an English version of the Summaries that makes sense to the contemporary general reader. They avoid the usual practice of merely transliterating technical terms, so that for instance 'intensio', 'remissio', and 'corruptio' become 'strengthening', 'weakening', and 'passing away', all of which strike me as superior to the usual 'intension', 'remission', and 'corruption'. If a reader who is already acquainted with the usual practice is at all confused by these decisions, the Latin is on the opposite page for reference, and there is an index of Latin terms. The presence of the Latin will also help when the same word is translated in different ways, as when 'consequens' is translated as 'consequent' if paired with 'antecedens', but as 'consequence' if used to mean something that follows. 'Consequentia' itself, meaning 'inference', is also translated as 'consequence'. Sometimes the translators' choices are particularly good, as when 'vox significativa' becomes 'a sign-making vocalization' (p. 103), but at other times it is unnecessarily heavy, as when 'copulativa' becomes 'coupled hypothetical' instead of the much simpler 'conjunction' (p. 115). A particular problem arises from the translation of both 'infinitum' and 'infinitiva' as 'unlimited'. This is helpful when used of a nomen infinitum such as 'non-man', for 'unlimited name' makes more sense than the usual 'infinite name', but is less helpful when 'oratio infinitiva' is rendered as 'unlimited statement' instead of 'infinitive phrase' (p. 305), especially when the infinitive phrase in question, "panem comedere canem," is rendered as the statement "bread eats dog." Another problem arises from Latin's lack of indefinite and definite articles. The translators generally cope well with that, but there are places (such as p. 149, para. 2) where an added 'the' should have been dispensed with.

There were a few other small errors and irritants. The introduction opens with a detailed discussion of papal history without making it sufficiently clear that this is only marginally relevant given that Peter turns out not to have been a pope. In both introduction and text it is very difficult to locate the large number of footnote references to the text, all of which are in the form 'LS n.m', where n. is the chapter number and m. the section number. Since there are twelve chapters, and the length of the sections varies from part of a page to more than one page, the reader needs the help of full running titles, which are not provided. Finally, while the introduction and text themselves seem to be refreshingly free of typographical errors and infelicities, the same cannot be said of the bibliography. 'Longeway' and 'Mullally' are misspelled, as is the title of Peter of Spain (1992); French accents are sometimes omitted; and a number of translators, including Stump, Klima, Kretzmann, Mullally, Loux, and Freddoso have been mistakenly credited with editions of the medieval texts they translated, while Joke Spruyt is not credited with either her edition or her translation of Peter of Spain (1989).

It was probably inevitable that such a monumental work should give rise to some criticisms, but these are minor in relation to the total achievement. Future generations of students and scholars will undoubtedly be grateful to Copenhaver, Normore and Parsons for this splendid publication.