Peter Singer and Christian Ethics: Beyond Polarization

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Charles C. Camosy, Peter Singer and Christian Ethics: Beyond Polarization, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 278pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521149334.

Reviewed by Russell DiSilvestro, California State University-Sacramento


It might appear strained to use the phrase "Beyond Polarization" for the subtitle of a book on Peter Singer and Christian ethics. After all, sometimes Singer's positions and Christian ethical positions seem to look like polar opposites. And Singer himself, like Friedrich Nietzsche before him, has sometimes stressed why his moral positions are quite different than, and superior to, those found in Christian ethics.

Charles Camosy argues that such appearances do not adequately reflect a more complex reality. Peter Singer's moral ideas often spring from, resonate with, and explicitly overlap the ideas found within Christian ethics, at various points both theoretical and practical. The willingness of Christian ethicists and Singer to engage one another in ways beyond polarization is both longstanding and increasing. And while many points of difference and genuine polarization persist, it is illuminating and important to emphasize the common ground between Singer and Christian ethics as we move forward in the 21st century.

Camosy's "basic thesis" is a conditional:

if Christians and those who take Peter Singer's approach engage each other in the spirit of intellectual solidarity, rather than defining by opposition, we will find . . . that our disagreements are actually quite narrow and interesting, and . . . that we can work together on many important issues of ethics and public policy (7).

The phrase "intellectual solidarity" is borrowed from David Hollenbach. It signifies a receptive and hospitable "orientation of mind" which, among other things, "regards differences among traditions as stimuli to intellectual engagement across religious and cultural boundaries." It also "leads one to view differences positively rather than with a mindset marked by suspicion or fear" (7).

The five topics Camosy gives sustained attention to are abortion, euthanasia and end-of-life issues, non-human animals, duties to the poor, and ethical method. He treats each first by mapping out "significant and non-trivial agreement" and "surprisingly narrow disagreement," and then by making an argument about "how Singer and/or the Church should push each other" with regard to the disagreement (8).

Consider some representative examples of how this works in each case. On abortion, Camosy argues that both Singer and the Church agree that: a "privacy-centered moral neutrality" is inadequate for public policy; if one admits the fetus is a "person" (i.e., an individual with the sort of moral status you and I have), then it is both wrong to end its life and wrong not to support it with one's body; Roe v. Wade is mistaken for some of the same reasons (e.g., viability is not morally significant); and a close logical connection should be recognized between the morality of abortion and infanticide. Their disagreements, Camosy maintains, are less about "speciesism" and more about the moral importance of "the natural potential" of human beings. He thinks the Church can "push" Singer here with (among other things) the argument that appealing to the "natural potential" of some classes of adult human beings (e.g., the severely mentally disabled and the mildly comatose) seems necessary to secure their personhood.

On euthanasia, both sides are: skeptical about using brain death as a decisive marker for the death of human organisms; skeptical about the alleged moral difference between refusing to act to benefit a dying patient and actively killing that dying patient; willing to consider the consequences as morally relevant to end-of-life care; and willing to allow a doctor to give a patient pain medication that will accelerate that patient's death. Of course, the disagreements concern the moral reasons for allowing such pain medications, the question of whether aiming at the death of an innocent patient is intrinsically evil, and the slippery-slope concerns over legalizing physician-assisted suicide. Both can push each other in different ways and can still work together against distorting forms of consumerism and autonomy as they pressure our end-of-life decisions.

When it comes to non-human animals, Camosy argues that Singer has both much to teach the Church and much to learn. Singer's narrative about the Church's responsibility for non-human animal suffering needs correction from both Scripture and church history. But Singer's oversight is understandable, since the Church herself needs to recapture the insights of her own best thinkers about non-human animals -- not just the standard historical figure of St. Francis of Assisi, but other historical and contemporary (yet conservative!) figures like "C. S. Lewis, Pope John Paul II, Stanley Hauerwas, Mary Eberstadt, Matthew Scully, and Pope Benedict XVI" (134). The result will be a Christian reaffirmation of the importance of animal welfare and indeed animal liberation, a turning away from factory farming and other inhumane practices of animal abuse, and a turning towards a kind of Christian moral vegetarianism.

Duties to the poor, Camosy argues, are perhaps the area where the common ground between Singer and Christians most outweighs the small differences that do exist. Relying on Scripture, church history, and contemporary Catholic Social Teaching, he highlights how there is fruitful overlap between both the structure of the arguments and practical policy upshots. Comparing Singer's famous treatment of the drowning child with Jesus' parable of the Good Samaritan, he explains why each recognizes that it is more effective to have some kind of identification and personal connection with the recipient of your aid so that you are not merely giving your funds to reduce an anonymous statistic.

Finally, in his chapter on ethical theory, Camosy points out substantial agreements between Singer and the Church (consequences matter; moral rules are useful but at least occasionally overridable). He notes, however, that their differences are persistent and largely traceable to different views about what a human person's true fulfillment consists in (God or something else?). This chapter also includes brief but illuminating discussions of the principle of double effect, proportionalism, and the possibility of Christian utilitarianism -- e.g., that of William Paley, R. M. Hare (Singer's Oxford mentor), and Joseph Fletcher.

In an interesting chapter which he titles "Singer's Shift," Camosy discusses the way Singer's recent work illustrates a greater willingness to consider the reality of objective ethical truths that are not dependent on what people desire. He quotes several recent talks and writings of Singer's that illustrate his openness to move away from the typical "preference utilitarianism" that he has been defending towards a more objective picture. Camosy considers several reasons why Singer has been moving in this direction, and he explains why he thinks this openness bodes well for the future of interaction between Singer and Christian ethicists.

Let me conclude this review with three thoughts about the project as a whole.

First: one of my favorite aspects of this book is its usefulness as an introduction and springboard to further research. Camosy's discussions and direct quotations from other authors are extensive. The sheer number of footnotes illustrates how wide-ranging Camosy's reading of other thinkers was. Perhaps the most distinctive and useful tool in the book is the Appendix: a summary chart comparing the way Singer and Christian ethics seem to answer more than 80 yes-or-no questions, organized according to the main chapter divisions. Add to this a good index and extensive bibliography, and you can see why this book will be a first stop for further work exploring the relationship between Peter Singer and Christian ethics.

Second: there is something inevitably selective in trying to represent "Christian ethics." While Camosy makes both the right sorts of efforts and the right sorts of disclaimers, his strategy still leaves something to be desired. While he relies on many Protestant writers throughout the book, he admits "When I refer to the views of 'the Church' . . . I will most often mean the current teaching of Roman Catholicism." This is not meant to be exclusionary but "is merely a shorthand way of referring to a particular approach to Christian ethics" (9). While I am neither Catholic nor Orthodox, I found that the latter were not well represented (e.g., there is just one passing reference to H. T. Englehardt) and the former were only somewhat selectively represented (e.g., Robert George, Singer's colleague at Princeton, was not discussed much).

Third: I agree with Camosy's methodological aspiration to search for common ground with Peter Singer, emphasizing shared convictions and approaches, and being willing to push and be pushed in return. While it is cliché not to judge a book by its cover, I could not help but notice that the illustration on the front cover -- the confluence of the Sacramento and Feather rivers -- suggests how two streams of thought might flow in the same direction and mix with each other to the benefit of those further downstream. And the endorsement from Singer himself on the back cover reinforces this picture without downplaying the distinctness of the two streams:

Philosophy makes progress through criticism that is based on a sound grasp of the position under scrutiny, acknowledging its strengths as well as seeking to expose its weaknesses. Charles Camosy does exactly that, which is why, despite the deep disagreements between us, I regard Peter Singer and Christian Ethics as a valuable contribution to philosophy in general, and to applied ethics in particular.

And yet, I think that in some places the search for common ground and optimism, while not perhaps a "strain" (the word I used in the first paragraph of this review), is nevertheless a bit of a "stretch." To recall the photo from the front cover again: rivers of water and thought sometimes combine, but they sometimes split. Two may join to make one, but sometimes one forks into two.

Still, overall, I think this book is a success, and highly recommend it.