Petrified Intelligence: Nature in Hegel's Philosophy

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Alison Stone, Petrified Intelligence: Nature in Hegel's Philosophy, SUNY Press, 2005, 224pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0791462943.

Reviewed by Judith Norman, Trinity University


For several decades feminist scholars have been engaged in a fruitful research program subjecting traditional theories of science to critique. The terms of this critique are familiar enough by now; it has as its target the Baconian paradigm of an active (read: male) scientist manipulating, describing, and laying bare the secrets of inert and pliable (read: female) nature. The critique holds that this model of scientific discovery leads to bad philosophy, bad politics, and, it is increasingly clear, bad science.

It leads to bad philosophy because it results in an alienated view of nature as essentially dead and meaningless, a view which, minimally, fails to capture our experience of the dynamism and interconnectedness evident in nature. It is bad politics because it does not recognize intrinsic values in nature; it encourages us (them) to view nature merely as a resource to exploit. And it is bad science because in refusing to acknowledge agency in nature, it fails to recognize many of the creative capacities of natural systems.

Although she does not phrase the issue in terms of gender politics, Alison Stone's reading of Hegel is informed by this line of eco-feminist criticism. She argues that Hegel provides the resources for a non-traditional view of nature, one that "re-enchants" nature by recognizing its inherent agency and intelligence and viewing it as a locus of value and reason. Thus, Hegelian philosophy of nature offers a vantage point for a deep-seated critical assessment of the traditional, ecologically destructive paradigm.

Stone ties this fashionable line of criticism to an very unfashionable reading of Hegel. Not only does she see him as a metaphysician with a strictly rationalist, a priori theory of nature, but she argues that this reading is essential for articulating his ecological concerns. Hegel approaches the study of nature a priori, by first deducing the order and structure of natural forms given the internal, dialectical logic of the concept [Begriff]. Once this logical grid is in place, Hegel then turns to the empirical sciences to see how well they mesh with his deductive system. (Since nature has an irreducibly unpredictable, stochastic element, it only imperfectly embodies the rationality of the concept. As a result, Hegel occasionally needs to supplement or modify his logical grid with the results of the empirical sciences.)

Stone defends this reading (which she calls a "strong a priori" one) against a "weak a priori" understanding of Hegel's method which holds that Hegel always tailors his logic to the results of the existing empirical sciences (rather than adjusting his logic only occasionally, at the edges, as the strong reading holds). She further argues that the strong a priori account has an affinity with a more metaphysical understanding of Hegel's philosophy in general. She does not defend her preferred reading on textual grounds, stating that Hegel's methodological pronouncements are too ambiguous. Rather, she claims that the strong a priori reading is more philosophically cogent, since it does not absolutize the findings of current science, as does the weak a priori reading. In order for the weak reading to become equally cogent, it would have to construe Hegel's project as essentially a posteriori, claiming that when it comes to nature, at least, the progress of the concept must be charted empirically rather than logically (deductively).

On Stone's reading, Hegel's philosophy of nature could still be relevant to contemporary science, and not just an historical curiosity as it must be on the weak reading. But Stone's strong reading allows her to go even further, by offering a standpoint for criticizing contemporary science as well, which would not be the case with an a posteriori reading. So at the end of the day, Stone's principal reason for preferring her strong reading is the fact that it offers this critical perspective -- it is not only the reason we should read Hegel's philosophy of nature today, it is the reason we should read Hegel's philosophy of nature the way Stone does, as strongly a priori metaphysics.

The high point of the book is Stone's demonstration of her strong a priori approach in action. Her reading is a real tour de force, using the Philosophy of Mind to shed light on the notoriously obscure Philosophy of Nature. She shows how Hegel describes the logic of existing natural forms in sui generis, nonscientific, distinctively philosophical terms. Specifically he describes nature as intrinsically rational, characterized by the internal dynamic principle of the rational development of the idea. He then takes the empirical descriptions of natural scientists and maps them onto this metaphysics. A satisfying description of nature, then, will have two layers: a metaphysics and a corresponding empiricism.

Hegel makes no claim to originality for this two-tiered approach. In fact, he believes that empirical science has always made tacit appeal to a metaphysics: the metaphysical assumption that objects are essentially bare -- devoid of reason and subject to external forces. In a nutshell, Stone's argument from here on is that this barren metaphysics is an inadequate one; it fails to provide science with the resources to describe nature in a way we can find phenomenologically and ethically compelling. Hegel's metaphysics, on the other hand, allows for just such a phenomenologically and ethically compelling description. As such, philosophers and scientists today could learn much from Hegel's philosophy of nature.

Stone pretty much accepts Hegel's contention that science was and is based on a metaphysics of barren, unconnected and non-rational objects, a view she supports rather feebly, by showing that it is not inconsistent with Heidegger's assessment of science. But Heidegger notwithstanding, there have been plenty of scientists, from Leibniz up through contemporary exponents of complexity theory, who have accepted a much more dynamic image of scientific objects. This is a symptom of a general weakness in Stone's account: for a book that considers itself critical of contemporary science as a whole, Stone's argument is curiously divorced from any discussion of what scientists in fact say or do (with the somewhat disastrous exception of Goethe, as I will discuss later).

But then, Hegel does not seem to care about what scientists say either -- he thinks that working scientists will necessarily presuppose an inadequate metaphysics of bare and unconnected objects. He is not out to change their minds, he just downgrades them to the status of technicians whose job is to record facts that a real metaphysician such as Hegel can translate into a more adequate, a priori picture of reality. And unfortunately a lot of the urgency Stone claims for the project of an autonomous metaphysics of nature such as Hegel's can be fairly easily countered by noting that empirical science itself is eminently capable of reform.

Still, Stone believes that Hegel's a priori metaphysical approach has two advantages that give it enduring relevance, two things to offer that contemporary science does not. First, she argues that Hegel's procedure is uniquely able to capture our pre-scientific experience of nature; and second she shows that Hegel captures a sense of nature's intrinsic value in a way that our current scientific paradigm does not. (She wisely dismisses Hegel's claim that his theory gives better scientific explanations than empirical scientists do). Let us turn to these points.

The first argument appeals to a phenomenology of sense experience. Stone freely admits that Hegel does not explicitly make this argument, but she reconstructs it from hints and suggestions that she uncovers in the text. Hegel claims that his theory captures our pre-scientific experience of nature better than empirical science does -- that our faculty of sensibility absorbs impressions of the elemental forces of nature (the interaction between earth, air, fire, and water) in a proto-rational manner, according to the laws of an implicit logic that Hegel, unlike scientific theories, is able to describe and explain.

Stone builds the case that Hegel does make this argument by looking at his theory of practical education, and taking seriously the fact that, unlike Kant, he believes that our natural instincts should be tempered and educated by reason, rather than mortified. She draws out an analogy between this and a theoretical education that would preserve and articulate our sensible experience, rather than just deny it in favor of reason. In both cases, sense (instinct) needs to be respected and brought into line with reason.

This is an intriguing argument, but it is largely analogical and not particularly tight. As she sees Hegel's theory of theoretical education, a philosophy of science should select out and articulate (that is, express in concepts) the essential elements of our na•ve apprehension; and this is quite distant from Hegel's notion of practical education, which holds that that sensibility really needs to be developed: articulated in the sense of altered and redirected. Still, Stone brings to her defense passages where Hegel does seem to play the phenomenology card against empirical science -- for instance, by emphasizing the manner in which his philosophy preserves the results of Goethe's famous (and famously anti-Newtonian) phenomenological theory of colors.

More worryingly, we might wonder why a satisfying theory of nature should have to capture our pre-theoretical sensations at all. We come across all sorts of spurious patterns on a phenomenological level -- animal figures in clouds and profiles in cliffs. Why should we think this sort of experience has anything to do with the way nature really operates?

Stone herself poses this question and worries over the answer. She notes that a phenomenologically attuned theory would present a more familiar, less alienated picture of the world than does a science that ignores what we see and talks about calculus and unimaginable entities such as Higgs bosons. But this does not make the phenomenologically attuned theory true. It is surely relevant (although Stone does not mention this) that the phenomenologically impeccable Goethe got colors basically wrong and the cold, hard physicist Newton got them right.

Stone defends the phenomenological approach in the face of this objection by saying that our senses must have some privileged proximity to what is occurring in nature, because they themselves are natural. (Again, she admits that Hegel only hints at this argument.) She writes: "because we have emerged from nature, the system of our senses arises as a recapitulation of preexisting patterns that objectively structure various natural forms" (p. 131). Thus, there must be something correct about our sensuous grasp of nature that science ignores at its peril.

This argument cannot be taken seriously after Darwin. We now know that our senses have evolved to enable us to survive and reproduce, not to present a veridical picture of the world. Of course they operate according to the same laws and patterns that all natural systems follow, but this gives us no prima facie evidence whatsoever that our sensuous experience of events allows us to detect these patterns better than scientific enquiry does, and this is the claim Stone makes on Hegel's behalf.

A certain recent and very fruitful strand of complexity theory does discuss the fact that the same patterns of self-organization governing phenomena on the social or historical level also govern small-scale physical processes such as crystal formation. Stone does not cite this (or any contemporary scientific) theory or indeed say much beyond the vaguely suggestive remark cited above. But it is worth noting that this research program in complexity theory does not claim that these ubiquitous patterns cohere with anything presented in unanalyzed sense experience. And even if it did, this theory would rather speak against Hegel, since it comes from empirical science itself, which apparently does not need a rationalist metaphysician to tell it what to be looking for.

Unfortunately, something like this phenomenological argument ultimately underwrites Stone's account of what she considers Hegel's other successful defense of his metaphysical theory of nature, a defense based on ethical considerations. It holds that we should accept Hegel's philosophy because it gives us grounds for acknowledging the intrinsic goodness of all natural forms. Since nature is suffused with reason, and reason is good, nature is good too, in proportion to the amount of reason it exhibits.

As Stone is quick to point out, this seemingly positive assessment of the moral value of nature rests alongside Hegel's strong and explicit disavowal that humans have any duties towards nature other than to exploit it as much as possible. Humans are capable of suffusing nature with even more value-giving reason than it already has by eating it or using it as resources for our ends. So at the end of the day, Hegel comes firmly down on the wrong side of environmentalism. The problem, as Stone points out, is that Hegel does not see nature as valuable in its materiality, just in its rationality. So Hegel does not accord respect for nature as such, just for nature to the extent that it shows the trace of mind.

But Stone will not take this as the final word; she insists that there is in fact a tension in Hegel's thought -- that he is being inconsistent when he dismisses nature as a resource. In this case, inconsistency is a good thing, because it means Hegel had his heart in the right place in spite of himself. And this is where the phenomenological argument comes in. Hegel thinks that an advantage of his theory is the fact that it acknowledges and captures our phenomenological experience of nature. Stone applies this axiom to the case at hand by noting that our pre-theoretical experience reveals nature to be intrinsically worthy of respect. This means that Hegel is ultimately disloyal to his own phenomenological commitments if he is going to simply dismiss this feeling and regard nature as a tool for our own ends. Stone does not argue that many or most people share this sense of nature's intrinsic worth -- nor is it clear how she would really go about defending this point.

I share Stone's evident desire to reconstruct a counter-tradition of ecological sensitivity, but unfortunately I am not ultimately persuaded that Hegel belongs to this tradition. At the end of the day, the ethical argument rests on the rather wobbly legs of the phenomenological argument. And even if Hegel could be shown to display some level of moral ambiguity with respect to our responsibility towards nature (which is the most that she is claiming), what would follow? There remains the broader question (which Stone does not address) of whether the intellectual grounds for respecting nature really do (or could) come from a metaphysics of nature formulated in isolation from scientific procedure and political reality. The fact that environmental destruction harms not just nature but economically disadvantaged peoples as well as future generations suggests that ecological insensitivity is a symptom of a much greater problem than an inadequate metaphysics of nature.

This would certainly strip Stone's project of some of its grander claims to contemporary relevance and urgency. But this should not detract from Stone's genuine historical contribution, a compelling reconstruction of Hegel as a metaphysician of nature.