Phenomenal Qualities: Sense, Perception, and Consciousness

Placeholder book cover

Paul Coates and Sam Coleman (eds.), Phenomenal Qualities: Sense, Perception, and Consciousness, Oxford University Press, 2015, 435pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198712718.

Reviewed by Brian Cutter, University of Notre Dame


Phenomenal qualities can be understood, roughly and intuitively, as the qualities associated with a conscious state that constitute "what it's like" to be in that state. Many of the enduring questions in philosophy of mind are about phenomenal qualities. For example, one dimension of the mind-body problem is the problem of integrating phenomenal qualities into the picture of reality presented by the physical sciences. Phenomenal qualities also take center stage in the philosophy of perception. Are sensory colors objective properties of external surfaces, or properties of inner states or sense data that we erroneously project onto external objects? Must a sensory quality be instantiated whenever it is present to conscious awareness, or might it be merely represented without being instantiated? Phenomenal qualities are also involved in recent debates about the nature and existence of cognitive phenomenology, which can be understood as debates about what kinds of phenomenal qualities there are.

This volume contains 14 essays by top-rate philosophers of mind (and one vision scientist) on the topic of phenomenal qualities, along with a philosophically substantive introduction by the editors. It does a good job covering the breadth of philosophical and empirical issues associated with phenomenal qualities. However, because these issues range so widely, the collection often feels a bit diffuse and unfocused. Nonetheless, the contributions are, for the most part, high-quality and interesting. Below is a summary of the volume's four sections, with a selective focus on two chapters from each section.

Section I, "The Ontology of Phenomenal Qualities" discusses the metaphysical nature of phenomenal qualities and their relation to the properties that figure in the physical sciences. With the exception of David Rosenthal's "Quality Spaces and Sensory Modalities," all the essays in this section are critical of standard physicalist accounts of phenomenal qualities.

Sam Coleman's ambitious "Neuro-Cosmology" develops a comprehensive metaphysical framework founded on the doctrine of "panqualityism," the view that the basic building blocks of reality are qualities. Qualities can be understood roughly as properties that are "not merely relational" (p. 73). His argument for panqualityism begins with the putative datum that we instantiate qualities -- for example, the qualities present to conscious awareness in sensory experience, like the "occurrent pinkness" presented in a perception of a pink ice cube. (He rejects the idea that these sensory qualities are merely represented by sensory experience, maintaining that they are necessarily instantiated whenever we are conscious of them.) Given the further assumptions that we are wholly composed of matter, that no qualitative property is implied by any collection of non-qualitative properties, and that high-level properties are intelligibly grounded in the basic properties of matter, he concludes that "basic matter is qualitative" (p. 77). Qualities are invisible to physical science, which can only describe the world's relational structure. But what ultimately underlies the abstract web of relations described by science is a vast mosaic of active qualities in "absolute process," qualities of a kind with those that figure in ordinary episodes of human consciousness.

Coleman's panqualityism differs from its close relative, panpsychism, in holding that qualities are not "intrinsically conscious" (p. 66). A quality is conscious only when a subject stands in a relation of conscious awareness to it. Since science charts the relational structure of reality, Coleman is optimistic that the relation of conscious awareness (unlike qualities themselves) can be given a scientific (relational/functional) analysis. He concludes by sketching an account of conscious awareness: qualities in our brains come to be objects of conscious awareness in virtue of being quotationally embedded in a higher-order thought. This chapter could be fruitfully read alongside chapter 14, "Technical Issues in Naive Sense-Datum Theory," in which John M. Nicholas attempts to reconcile the view that phenomenal qualities are located in the brain (as features of neurally realized sense data) with the findings of neuroscience.

Philip Goff's "Real Acquaintance and Physicalism", one of the high points of the volume, develops an argument against reductive physicalist views of phenomenal qualities. He begins by introducing the notion of real acquaintance, an intimate relation between subjects and their phenomenal qualities in virtue of which the following facts hold:

Revelation: A psychologically normal subject can come to know the real nature of one of her phenomenal qualities by attending to that quality.

Phenomenal Certainty: A psychologically normal subject is able to put herself into a situation in which, with respect to one of her phenomenal qualities, she is justified in being certain that that quality is instantiated. (p. 124)

One reason to accept the hypothesis that we are really acquainted with our phenomenal qualities, Goff argues, is that it provides the best explanation of two plausible theses, namely Phenomenal Certainty and

Phenomenal Insight: we have rich a priori knowledge concerning our phenomenal qualities.

For example, we know that phenomenal red is similar to phenomenal orange, that pain is (ceteris paribus) bad, and so on. Goff argues, fairly convincingly, that no plausible version of physicalism can accommodate both Phenomenal Certainty and Phenomenal Insight. From here, Goff puts forward the "acquaintance argument against physicalism." In condensed form: we are really acquainted with our phenomenal qualities. So if phenomenal qualities have a physical/functional nature, this would be revealed to us in introspection. But phenomenal qualities are not revealed to have a physical/functional nature in introspection. Therefore, physicalism is false.

Goff insists that he does not intend to be arguing against Russellian monism -- roughly, the view that our phenomenal qualities are grounded in the phenomenal or proto-phenomenal qualities of the fundamental physical entities, where the latter qualities serve as the categorical bases of the causal dispositions described by physics. Thus, he insists that the physicalism he targets does not include, for example, the panpsychist Russellian monism endorsed by Galen Strawson, who understands his own view as "physicalist" in a broader sense of the term. But there is something of a tension between Russellian monism and the doctrine of real acquaintance. If I am really acquainted with my phenomenal qualities, then attentive introspection reveals the nature of these qualities. But if Russellian monism is true, then phenomenal qualities, such as the phenomenal blue of which I am now conscious, are grounded in the phenomenal or proto-phenomenal qualities of the fundamental physical entities. Now, it's plausible that if phenomenal blue is grounded in other qualities, then this is a truth that belongs to its nature.[1] So if I am really acquainted with phenomenal blue, as Goff supposes, then it ought to be evident to me that this quality is metaphysically derivative, not fundamental. But (I claim) this is not evident in introspection. Attentive introspection does not rule out the possibility that phenomenal blue is metaphysically basic, not reducible to or derivative from anything else. On the face of it, then, Russellian monism seems to conflict with the doctrine of real acquaintance after all. (Indeed, Goff himself raises a related objection to one popular form of Russellian monism in another work.[2] His own sympathies lie instead with a non-standard "cosmo-psychist" form of Russellian monism according to which human consciousness is grounded top-down in the consciousness of the cosmos. But the objection above seems to apply to his "top-down" Russellian monism no less than to any "bottom-up" variety.)

Section II, "Perception and Phenomenal Qualities" discusses the role that phenomenal qualities play in perception.

Paul Coates ("Projection, Revelation, and the Function of Perception") develops a projectivist version of the causal theory of perception. He argues that the phenomenal qualities that characterize what it's like to undergo a given perceptual experience are qualities of our inner states. Non-conceptual awareness of these qualities causally guides our conceptual classification of the external objects of perception. With regard to the function of perception, Coates endorses the "Navigational Picture," according to which the primary function of perception is not to put the subject in direct acquaintance with external objects, but to enable the subject to successfully navigate her environment. Although he holds that phenomenal qualities are qualities of inner states rather than external objects, he is keen to insist that his view is not committed to indirect realism, for conceptual awareness of external objects is not based on a prior conceptual awareness of internal states. Still, he maintains that our conceptual awareness of external objects is causally prompted by non-conceptual awareness of inner phenomenal qualities. So, at least on one fairly standard understanding of indirect realism as the view that awareness of external items is explained or caused by awareness of internal items, Coates seems to be committed to indirect realism after all.[3] He also insists that his view is not committed to an error theory of color, but it was not clear in the end how he manages to avoid this commitment. He concedes that our perceptual judgments about color "attribute the phenomenal colors that we are immediately aware of to external surfaces" (p. 202). Moreover, he insists that these phenomenal colors do not belong to external surfaces, but rather to inner states of the subject. It follows that our attributions of phenomenal colors to surfaces are erroneous. In what sense, then, is this not an error theory?

Galen Strawson's "Real Direct Realism: Reflections on Perception" is a rich, historically informed, and thoroughly enjoyable set of reflections on the nature of perception. A number of bold claims are advanced, occasionally with argument, though often as brash assertions put forward as perfectly obvious truisms. (It is fitting that his essay, brimming with controversial claims, has as its epigraph Iris Murdoch's remark: "Philosophy is often a matter of finding a suitable context in which to say the obvious.") These claims include: (i) perception is direct; there are no perceptual intermediaries standing between the perceiver and the external object of perception. (ii) However, direct realism does not entail the currently popular view that color-as-we-see-it is "a quality that is spread out on the surface of bodies," a view whose falsity is "beyond all reasonable doubt" (p. 216). (iii) The nature of an experience is revealed to us in having the experience. (iv) Experience is a wholly physical phenomenon, though its nature cannot be explicated in scientific terms. (v) Perception necessarily involves mental representation. (vi) Disjunctivism is "certainly false." (vii) The transparency thesis is incompatible with direct realism (and therefore false).

Section III, "The Kinds and Character of Phenomenal Qualities" covers a motley set of issues, including debates about metaphysical realism, non-conceptual content, color perception, the nature of pain, and cognitive phenomenology.

David Papineau's impressive "Can We Really See a Million Colours?" makes a surprisingly compelling case for the counterintuitive and heterodox view that we are only capable of a few dozen conscious visual color responses, against the orthodox view that we are capable of well over a million. In a bit more detail: he holds that there are two general kinds of color responses, each governed by a distinct perceptual mechanism. On the one hand, there are categorical color responses produced by a "surface classifier," which assigns perceived surfaces to one of a few dozen coarse-grained color categories (e.g. pink, orange, olive green, navy blue). On the other hand, there are relational color responses, produced by a mechanism whose function is to detect similarities and differences between distinct surfaces. Although the inputs to the latter mechanism may include (unconscious) representations of fine-grained categorical features of the surfaces under comparison, this information is not retained in its conscious output. On this view, perception of color differences is a gestalt phenomenon: "We can often consciously see straight off that two adjacent surfaces are different in color without first consciously having two different responses to each surface" (p. 274). We might summarize the point by saying that there can be an appearance of difference without a difference of appearance.

Papineau marshals support for this account of color perception from neuroscience as well as from general considerations about the function of color vision. The account is also said to have explanatory benefits. First, he argues that it provides a satisfying explanation of the non-transitivity of color indiscriminability. Second, it provides the conceptualist with a powerful response to the classic objection that color perception is fine-grained in a way that outstrips our conceptual capacities. If we are only capable of a few dozen categorical color responses, our visual representations of color may not outrun our conceptual repertoire after all.

Michelle Montague's "The Life of the Mind" addresses the question: what makes an occurrent thought conscious? Her final answer is that conscious occurrent thoughts are conscious in virtue of having cognitive phenomenology, a special kind of phenomenology distinct from and irreducible to sensory phenomenology. The cognitive-phenomenological properties that render a given occurrent thought conscious put us in direct experiential contact with the thought's content, and are essentially possessed by any thought with that content. The bulk of the chapter is spent criticizing rival accounts, including a functionalist account that explains what makes a thought conscious in terms of Block's notion of access-consciousness, and a "sensory" account which explains what makes a thought conscious in terms of accompanying sensory phenomenology.

According to one simple version of the sensory account, my thought that grass is green is made conscious by its intimate association with certain sensory phenomenology, such as the phenomenology attaching to visual imagery of a green patch or auditory imagery of the English sentence "grass is green." Montague objects to this proposal on the grounds that the association of sensory imagery with the content of the thought is arbitrary. There is no specific kind of sensory imagery that necessarily accompanies the thought that grass is green. On this point she is surely correct, but it's unclear why this amounts to an objection. She says that given the arbitrariness of the association between imagery and thought content, it is mysterious "exactly how an image of a green patch accounts for John's conscious occurrent thought . . . being the conscious thought that grass is green." But this complaint moves the goal posts. The initial challenge was to explain what makes an occurrent thought conscious, not what makes an occurrent thought have the content that it does. It may be that an occurrent thought that grass is green qualifies as conscious in virtue of an intimate association with (conscious) sensory imagery, even if that imagery can't explain why the thought has the content that grass is green. Her second objection to the sensory account is stronger. If the only phenomenology associated with a conscious thought is sensory phenomenology, then it seems that we only consciously entertain the content of the associated sensory imagery (e.g. green patch), which will typically differ from the content of the thought. But this consequence conflicts with the plausible assumption that an occurrent thought is conscious only if we consciously entertain its content.

The chapters in Section IV, "Phenomenal Qualities and Empirical Findings" discuss attention, synaesthesia, and the prospects of finding sense data in the brain. Though heterogeneous in content, these chapters are unified by their extensive engagement with empirical psychology and neuroscience.

In "A Function-Centered Taxonomy of Visual Attention", Ronald A. Rensink suggests that we understand attention in terms of a coordinated operation of distinct processes. An attentional process is a process that is "contingently selective, controlled on the basis of global considerations" (p. 248). He develops a "function-centered taxonomy" of visual attention that describes and relates such processes. Rensink begins by listing a number of constraints that a taxonomy should meet and then proposes a specific set of processes meeting these constraints. The proposed taxonomy features the processes of Attentional Sampling, Attentional Filtering, Attentional Binding, Attentional Holding (stabilizing), and Attentional Individuating (indexing). Toward the end of the chapter he discusses the relationship between attentional processes and different forms of visual experience. Three kinds of visual experience are posited: (i) fragmentary experience, in which the subject has access to a dense and relatively unstructured array of simple localized features, (ii) assembled experience, which combines simple sensory features with a layer of static structure, and (iii) coherent experience, which involves an impression of continuity over time. He tentatively suggests that for each kind of visual experience, a distinct kind of attentional process is required.

In "A New Account of Synaesthesia as Enriched Experience", Ophelia Deroy defends a revisionary account of synaesthetic experience. The traditional view characterizes synaesthetic experience in terms of "the juxtaposition or binding of two contents of experience that we can independently have and easily imaginatively associate" (p. 377). On her view, synaesthesia should "be defined as cases where individuals enjoy a single, richer experience which might be hard for us to imagine" (p. 377). The notion of richness invoked here has to do with the number of dimensions in which experiences vary. Synaesthetic experiences are experiences that involve an extra non-separable dimension, rather than an extra feature which may be experienced or conceptualized separately. As an illustration of a non-separable dimension of experience, consider brightness, a dimension of color. Brightness is not conceptually independent of color, but constitutes a set of values by which colors appearances can vary. According to Deroy, when a synaesthete hears a middle C and reports having an experience of green, he is not experiencing the same feature an ordinary subject experiences when viewing a lime. Rather, he experiences contents with an extra dimension that is analogous to some dimension involved in an ordinary experience of green. The "phenomenal enrichment" that occurs in synaesthetic experience is a manifestation of the process of "incorporation," a process which is also said to occur in Cheves Perky's famous experiments, wherein perceptual contents are incorporated into the contents of imagination. One of the advertised benefits of Deroy's account of synaesthesia is that we are not forced to deny the veridicality of synaesthetic experiences, as we presumably would be if we held (for example) that syntesthetes literally perceive sounds as green.

This volume competently covers a wide range of philosophical and empirical issues pertaining to phenomenal qualities. Because it covers so much ground, few will find every chapter to be relevant to their interests. But most philosophers of mind, especially those interested in the metaphysics of phenomenal consciousness, will find much of interest in this volume.

[1] Cf. Kit Fine, "A Guide to Ground," In Fabrice Correia & Benjamin Schnieder (eds.), Metaphysical Grounding. Cambridge University Press, 2012, pp. 37-80

[2] See, e.g., his "Against Constitutive Russellian Monism," In Torin Alter & Yujin Nagasawa (eds.), Consciousness in a Physical World, Oxford University Press, 2015, pp. 370-400.

[3] Compare the definitions of indirect perception in Frank Jackson, Perception: A Representative Theory. Cambridge University Press, 1977, pp. 15-20 and Michael Huemer, Skepticism and the Veil of Perception. Rowman & Littlefield, 2001, pp. 55-7.