Phenomenologies of Art and Vision: A Post-Analytic Turn

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Paul Crowther, Phenomenologies of Art and Vision: A Post-Analytic Turn, Bloomsbury, 2013, 195pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441119735.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Powell, Marshall University


Paul Crowther adds this to his already impressive list of books treating the history of aesthetic inquiry. As much as anyone working in the aesthetic arena, he has managed to build a resume that has especially treated virtually all of the major figures in aesthetics from the 20th and 21st centuries, including proponents from both the continental and analytic traditions. This, his most recent book, attempts to assess both traditions as a whole by focusing on very specific figures -- Wollheim, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, Lacan, and Dufrenne -- and to then make a marriage of what he deems to be the strength of each tradition. From the continental side of the equation, Crowther applauds the phenomenological and post-phenomenological emphasis on the ontological import of the aesthetic object. From the analytic side of the equation, he wishes to draw from what he sees as the analytic talent for the construction of arguments. Each tradition, according to him, suffers from a weakness in the strength of the other tradition. The synthetic unity of the strength of each tradition is to give rise to Crowther's "post-analytic vision" provided in the title.

Crowther begins his study through an analysis of Wollheim's more subjectivist aesthetics, and as the first and only representative figure of the analytic treatment of aesthetics. One might argue with his choice of Wollheim, but this choice has to be justified by what Wollheim offers over figures previously treated in Crowther's other works.

Crowther devotes his first two chapters to Wollheim and to his own critique and subsequent extension of Wollheim. In his presentation of Wollheim, he draws attention to twofoldness in Wollheim. Twofoldness accounts for a perception of the surface of the work of art while also seeing something "in" the surface. In perceiving the work of art, seeing-in is obviously bound to twofoldness. The cause of such twofoldness is the intention of the artist, and the external descriptions of the work of art are judged to be either true or false, correct or incorrect, to the degree to which they correspond to the artist's intentions. However, abstract art, or at least a great deal of it, poses a challenge to such correctness and its corresponding criteria. Cowther thus builds on Wollheim by replacing "seeing-in" with "seeing-as." Whereas "seeing- in" is reliant on the intentions of the artist, "seeing-as" recognizes "the fatal dimension of ambiguity in respect of what exactly one can see in" (31) the abstract work of art, it recognizes the various seemingly contingent aspects of works of art that might be selected by the observer. What is more, what is selected goes beyond or behind any appeal to intention, but rather gets framed by a virtuality to which the work of art belongs simply by being determined as a work of art. Although Cowther does not reference Rancière here, it would seem that his sense of the virtual is itself being framed by what Rancière calls the "distribution of the sensible" (le partage du sensible). Crowther describes this in the following way: "to be recognized as works of art in any terms . . . raised by conventional picturing" (34). Instead of Rancière, Crowther prefers to relate this to what Merleau-Ponty called the invisible and which Crowther further explores through his own expression: transperceptual space (see especially 35-44).

In chapter 3, "Truth in Art: Heidegger against Contextualism," Crowther presents aspects of Heidegger's celebrated, "The Origin of the Work of Art," and argues Heidegger's case against some of Meyer Schapiro's critical comments concerning van Gogh's paintings of shoes. Schapiro's account of van Gogh's shoes, in contrast to Heidegger's account portraying them as belonging to a peasant woman, perfectly exhibits the limitations of Schapiro's "contextualized" account, limitations that Crowther views as pertaining to all contextualized renderings of art. That is, while the contextualized account might well reveal something about that context, what it reveals is a kind of historical documentation, and not an ontology of art. At the end of the day, who really cares if the shoes belonged to van Gogh or a peasant woman? But this is just the kind of answer that Schapiro's contextualized analysis provides rather than saying something about the nature or being of art. According to Crowther, through the Schapiro/Heidegger encounter,

We are led . . . to a most interesting question. Which of these two aspects -- visual documentation or art -- is closer to the ontological basis of the picture qua picture? And the answer must be art. . . . More specific functions -- such as creating or using images so as to denote quite specific historical individuals, items or states of affairs -- are of a derivative, secondary significance. (56)

While I would certainly agree with Crowther's pronouncement concerning Schapiro, I see no need, nor any convincing argument, to universalize denunciation of all contextualization merely as an inference based on the analysis of Schapiro. After all, it might well simply be that Schapiro has performed his task poorly (and I think he has).

In chapter 4, Crowther once again displays his fascination with Heidegger. However, this time he directs his attention to Heidegger's very late 1969 essay "Art and Space," which has received relatively little attention in the secondary literature. Crowther sees the essay as an important advance in Heidegger's treatment of space, in that "the individual thing itself should be regarded as place. It is this (as I shall call it) elemental notion of place which is ontologically fundamental" (66). However, place must be made for, and this occurs as a "clearing-away" that relates the place in which the individual thing manifests itself. This movement of clearing-away or spacing of place is the overcoming of space as it has been thought metaphysically. Sculpture is thus the activity par excellence of the overcoming of space and the spacing of place.

Chapter 5, "Vision in Being: Merleau-Ponty and the Depths of Painting," is, appropriately, the longest in the book. I say "appropriately" for it is in this chapter that Crowther really first begins to capitalize (or at least unfold) one specific instance of what he considers his post-analytic approach to art. After first presenting a general outline of the thinking of Merleau-Ponty, Crowther turns to a presentation of what is frequently considered Merleau-Ponty's most radical expositions, those of flesh, reversibility, and the visible and invisible. Crowther then turns to Merleau-Ponty's celebrated essay, "Cézanne's Doubt," to further solidify Merleau-Ponty's key notions, but also to argue that Merleau-Ponty introduces a hierarchy in painting in his privileging of Cézanne. In presenting Cézanne in this fashion, Crowther seizes the opportunity to correctly point out that Merleau-Ponty has had to take recourse to a critical, analytic function requiring a reflection that makes use of critical comparison. Such reflection, we will see, is that to which Crowther appeals for his post-analytic turn.

Crowther devotes chapter 6 to the writings of Jacques Lacan. Here, Crowther draws from the earlier translation of Lacan's Écrits and his Four Fundamental Concepts of Psychoanalysis. It is the latter text that performs most of the work in providing a pseudo-aesthetics drawn from the Lacanian discourse, especially the section entitled "Of the Gaze as Objet Petit a," and even more significantly the final chapter of the section, "What is a Picture?" Here Crowther focuses on the notion of gesture (usually as brushstroke in painting), which introduces an identification on the part of the viewer with the desire of the artist. That is, there occurs first a "laying down" or abandonment of the gaze of the viewer of the work of art. There is, in this abandonment, the attempt to adapt a viewing of the work of art as the artist views it. This attempt is made apparent in the realization that the work of art is a work of art and not a reality (so to speak) or even a representation of reality; rather, there is the realization that the work of art is the result of the desire of the Other or the artist. Thus the abandonment of the gaze corresponds to a realization of the work of art as a work of art. What is more, this realization introduces a gap or absence, which desire attempts to fulfill. This fulfillment occurs in the attempt "to inhabit that [world] of the artist. We attempt to see as he or she does" (123). But, there is also the realization that the artist is no longer attached to the work of art and as such the work operates only in the past tense, as a having been. The question here, it seems to me, is whether this really adds anything to the type of aesthetic inquiry in which Crowther wants to engage. That is, if the post-analytic approach he wishes to develop requires a kind of critical appraisal of artworks for comparison, inasmuch as the Lacanian operation seems more concerned with the nature of subjectivity (which Crowther at least minimally admits), then the work of art would seem to be largely relegated to being a pedagogical tool for that purpose rather than a development within the history of aesthetic inquiry.

The focus of the final chapter is Dufrenne's Phenomenology of Aesthetic Experience. While Crowther began his study with Wollheim, who provides a transition to a more phenomenological account of the ontological dimension of art, Dufrenne introduces a key element to Crowther's analytic pursuits that is not shared with the presentation of the phenomenology of art. That additional element is "Dufrenne's historical narrative of painting's ontological emancipation" (157). Dufrenne's ontology, through an emphasis on color and light, is viewed as being seamlessly integrated with history. Crowther emphasizes Dufrenne's historical account of the use of oil in achieving the aforementioned emancipation through the play of color and light. But, the question remains for Crowther that even if such an account is philosophically sound, "Dufrenne cannot identify criteria that explain just how a picture is able to engage our aesthetic attention" (159). Such a concern might well be important, but important for whom? Crowther's answer, an answer that I find particularly vexing, is that it is important for anyone possessing the desire for distinguishing between aesthetic and non-aesthetic objects, a distinction that seems persistently problematic for what Crowther has identified as ontological accounts of art.

What is most satisfying in Crowther's study is the degree to which his discussion concerning treatments of art and aesthetics maintains a discussion with actual works of art. While I might not always agree with where this leads his discussion of Heidegger and others, his analyses are nevertheless generally defensible. And while I might prefer others who treat Heidegger, Kant, Hegel, etc. and art -- I am thinking here especially of John Sallis -- I can think of no one who treats such variety in art as Crowther. I find this most recent addition to his extensive accounting of art and those who think about art most rewarding, and I recommend it to all.

As already noted, Crowther begins his study by claiming a need for the combining of the phenomenological and analytic philosophical traditions. The reasons he gives for this have already been provided. With the exception of his treatment of Wollheim, throughout his study the synthesis of these two traditions seems to have been substituted for a presentation of the phenomenological encounter with art (through the presentation of Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, Dufrenne, and Lacan's situatedness within this tradition). That is, until we read Crowther's conclusion. There, the distinction between phenomenology and the analytic tradition appears to me to be substituted for a distinction between the pre-reflective and the reflective. While admitting that most aesthetic judgments are pre-reflective, and "almost all our visual judgments are pre-reflective and intuitive" (164), reflective judgments are nevertheless subject to phenomenological analysis. Thus, while the phenomenological tradition favors the pre-reflective, that reflective judgments remain situated within a domain of experience makes the distinction between the two artificial.

So Crowther appeals to "a horizon of critical comparison which can be subjectively [i.e., pre-reflectively] and objectively [i.e., reflectively] orientated" (164). Despite the choice of orientation, what he wishes to emphasize for the phenomenological tradition is this critical horizon, a horizon that Crowther seems to believe is more aptly negotiated through an appeal to the analytic treatment of aesthetics, a negotiation he believes is resisted by the phenomenological tradition due to the tendency towards viewing the critical negotiation as an overwhelming intellectualization of aesthetics. However, what is really most problematic for the phenomenological traditions, according to Crowther, is not so much the recourse to the intelligible over the sensible, but rather

the problem is this. Analytic thought is seen as something of a barrier between the subject and Being because it involves disassembling some given qualitative whole, and reconstructing it without any hope of achieving the same level of unity as characterized by the original. (165)

I am not so confident that the entire phenomenological-existential tradition is reducible to this one "problem." It seems more likely that the fundamental problem identified by Crowther is more an issue for German Idealism, which is made absolutely clear by Schelling at the very beginning of his System of Transcendental Idealism. That the unity is not the same unity as that characterizing the beginning goes without saying, but more importantly philosophy or aesthetics cannot provide unity due to its lack of material conditions.