Phenomenology and Analysis: Essays on Central European Philosophy

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Chrudzimski, Arkadiusz and Wolfgang Huemer (eds.), Phenomenology and Analysis: Essays on Central European Philosophy, Ontos Verlag, 2004, 381pp, ?32.00 (pbk), ISBN 3937202366.

Reviewed by Dallas Willard , University of Southern California


This book is a collection of essays by outstanding authors who are, for the most part, already well-known contributors to the study of the background of 20th Century philosophy. The authors and their essays are, in order, Peter Simons, “Open and Closed Culture: A New Way to Divide Austrians”; Barry Smith, “Austria and the Rise of Scientific Philosophy”; Dagfinn Føllesdal, “Bolzanos bleibende Leistungen”; Christian Beyer, “Bolzano and Husserl on Singular Existential Statements”; Edgar Morscher, “Die Geburt der Gegenstandstheorie aus einem Missverständinis?”; Arkadiusz Chrudzimski, “Meinong und Supervaluation”; Wilhelm Baumgartner, “Brentano und die österreichische Philosophie”; Dieter Münch, “Franz Brentano und die katholische Aristoteles-Rezeption”; Wolfgang Huemer, “Husserl’s Critique of Psychologism and his Relation to the Brentano School”; Gianfranco Soldati, “Abstraction and Abstract Concepts: On Husserl’s Philosophy of Arithmetic;” Tommaso Piazza, “The Quest for the Synthetic A Priori: Husserl and Schlick’s Debate Revisited”; Robin Rollinger, “Austrian Theories of Judgment: Bolzano, Brentano, Meinong, and Husserl”; Roberto Poli, “Approaching Brentano’s Theory of Categories”; Dale Jacquette, “Assumption and Mechanical Simulation of Hypothetical Reasoning”; and Jan Woleski, “Malum, Transcendentalia and Logic.” The articles by Smith, Føllesdal and Münch have been published elsewhere, but the other articles were written for this volume.

Now it should go without saying that each of these essays, by such authors, contributes significantly to our understanding of “Central European” philosophy. Beyond that, it is difficult to discern any significant interplay between the essays, leading to a more penetrating grasp of the larger picture that the volume seems intended to sketch. Perhaps there is such, and I just missed it. In any case, I will first comment on two of the essays that I personally found very illuminating, and then turn to some questions about the volume as a whole and the project it seems to represent. That I select the particular essays that I do for comment should not be taken to indicate a judgment of their relative importance.

Edgar Morscher’s paper on the origination of Meinong’s Gegenstandstheorie casts light on a worry that occurs to one who comes to Meinong from Russell’s theory of “denoting” phrases or terms. In particular, one is apt to read Meinong, in the spirit of earlier Analytic philosophers, as if he were tripped up by a mistake of logical grammar. He mistook the structure of certain sentences, thinking they contained names which, in fact, were descriptions. And straightway he inferred, the story might go, that there must be or in some sense exist objects which the supposed names supposedly denoted. Since only a ’funny’ kind of being would meet the need, such a conclusion was unacceptable to right thinking philosophers, and a rewriting of the kinds of sentences in question would undercut the inference and unburden us of unwanted ontological complications. So that story goes.

It is somehow encouraging to see another possibility for Meinong. Morscher explains how Robert Zimmermann’s textbook presentation of Bolzano’s theory of “objectless representations” might have led Meinong to hold his views on representations without (actual) objects. On Bolzano’s theory a representation can be of actual things, it can be of non-actual things, such as number, triangle, Satz an sich, or it can be of something that does not exist in any sense. These latter he calls “objectless” (“gegenstandlos”) representations. The mark of actual being is causal efficacy. Actuality is a wholly “normal” property. Unfortunately, Bolzano also uses “existence” and “being” synonymously with “actuality,” and accordingly says of non-actual objects that they do not exist, but that there merely are.)

Robert Zimmermann, involved in the mid-19th Century educational reform movement in Austria, produced a required text, Philosophische Propaedeutic für Obergymnasien, divided into two parts, one on Empirical Psychology and the other on Formal Logic. In the latter, he incorporated long sections of Bolzano’s Wissenschaftslehre, and many passages almost word for word. Bolzano always encouraged his students and friends to use his ideas freely and without acknowledgement. Zimmermann took over Bolzano’s theory of objectual (“gegenständlich”) and objectless representations an sich, without mentioning Bolzano. And he did so in such a way that the objectless representation of merely possible or of impossible objects (golden mountains, round squares, etc.) not only is of or about some one thing as opposed to another; but, also, that what it is of or about in some sense is. All of this was contrary to Bolzano’s clear statements and intent. Zimmermann’s modification of Bolzano’s theory of objectless representations in themselves, whether intentional or not, “leads immediately to Meinong’s theory of objects, which guarantees an object for every representation—even if it may be a merely possible or even an impossible one.” (p. 100)

Morscher continues to develop the possible connections between Meinong’s theory and Zimmermann’s presentation of Bolzano’s views, by commenting on further ways Zimmermann manages to overwrite his clear distinction between representation and object. He does not claim to have shown that the source of Meinong’s theory lies in Zimmermann/Bolzano, or to have proof that Meinong was influenced by these passages in Zimmermann’s textbook or even knew of them. But he hopes to have incited further investigation in this direction. And that will also be welcome to those of use who find the “logical grammar” source of Meinong’s theory unappealing.

Dieter Münch contributes an illuminating discussion of how the study of Aristotle interacted with a major effort to reform and re-establish a specifically Catholic philosophy that would also be—unlike German Idealism—”scientific.” His paper overflows with fascinating details of the social dynamics, and especially of the ecclesiastical and theological issues and tensions, that were at play in the effort, in Catholic Germany and in Austria, to bring about a “complete restoration of ’Christian’ principles in society, in the life of the individual and in the family.” (p. 171) Much of Müch’s article is devoted to the contents of two journals, Civiltà cattolica, founded in 1849, and Der Katholik, New Series, beginning in 1858.

The major underlying issue for this effort was whether or not Catholic life and thought could become a living force in the contemporary world—especially, could it be “scientific”—within the confines of Catholic dogma. This was thought to be possible by rejecting accommodations to Modern Thought, on the one hand, and appropriating and adapting the Aristotelian-Catholic system already largely completed by Thomas Aquinas, on the other. (p. 176) The “redemption of the ancient, god-seeking philosophy” was to be done “by means of the substantive truth that came forward in Christ.” (p. 175)

Brentano was, of course, a major player in this effort, under the influence of his beloved professor, Franz Jakob Clemens, and of other now less well-know teachers. Certainly Brentano was to come into conflict with the Catholic church. That is fairly well known. Far less known is the depth of his involvement with and commitment to the program of the intellectual restoration of Catholic teachings, and how that led to his work on Aristotle, from his doctoral dissertation onward, and to his role in the “reception” of Aristotle among Catholic and non-Catholic thinkers of his day. Münch provides information on these matters which I suspect can be found in few if any other places. He goes in some detail into Brentano’s disagreement with Trendelenburg over the deduction of Aristotle’s ’categories’ (insisting upon the primacy of ontological over Greek linguistic considerations in this matter, pp. 186f), and he provides a thorough discussion of Brentano’s dispute with Zeller (pp. 188ff) over the “active” intellect in Aristotle and its possible immortality (which of course Brentano favored). Both of these encounters yield philosophically rich discussions that remain strongly relevant to contemporary work just because they concern such fundamental issues. But Brentano “found interesting in Aristotle precisely those themes that are relevant for the construction of a Catholic science.” (p. 193) Nevertheless, as his later life clearly demonstrated, he did not keep his thought in subjection to the Church or to Thomas Aquinas. This is seen most clearly in the re-direction of his thought under the influence of August Comte, and in his rejection of the old view of the soul as the subject of psychology and his turn to psychical phenomena instead. This had to go hand-in-hand with a rejection of the most fundamental distinctions of Aristotelian ontology and their replacement with a theory of wholes and parts, giving a new but still profound significance to Aristotle for Brentano and his school. In spite of his break with the Church over various matters, such as the infallibility of the Pope, he continued to the end to pursue the goal of a “Catholic science.”

I think the primary contribution of this volume lies in its illumination of the history of the thought and culture in which the work of Brentano and his students was submerged, and apart from which it has little philosophical life. Indeed, philosophical thought in the 19th century, of which Brentano and Central European Philosophy is but one chapter, is still eclipsed by the idea that “something happened”—possibly a “Revolution in Philosophy”—that makes it philosophically pointless or unrewarding. There is still widespread the suggestion that what happened was “Analytic Philosophy,” and that the way to show anything in the 19th Century to be worthwhile philosophically is to show it to be, really, “Analytic.” For a few decades those involved in “analysis” agreed upon what was being analyzed, and Analytic Philosophy could be identified as a kind of thinking that analyzes that. Those days are now long past, and whatever contrast there is between Analytic Philosopher and its ’other’ seems to be a certain difference of style. As Barry Smith puts it, with reference to the early Husserl, Bolzano, Brentano and Mach, they “employ a sober, scientific style, and shun pretensions.” (p. 46) I agree that there is a difference of degree here, but would not want to have to show that all those who self-identify as Analytic philosophers manage the high standard that Barry Smith suggests. And I am afraid that the term “scientific” (“wissenschaftlich”), which many Central European Philosophers still love to use today to characterize what they do, does not have the type of precise meaning that Analytic Philosophy supposedly prefers. It may even be a little pretentious. Or it may just mean good philosophy. (On the problem of making “scientific” intelligible, as applied to a philosophy, while avoiding “scientism,” I have written further in my paper, “Who Needs Brentano” (in The Brentano Puzzle, ed. Roberto Poli, Aldershot:Ashgate, 1998, 15-43); and on the current, precarious position of “Analytic” philosophy, see Aaron Preston, “Prolegomena to any Future History of Analytic Philosophy,” Metaphilosophy , 2004, pp. 445-465.)

In any case, these are essays well worth reading, and not just for historical understanding, but for illumination of logical issues as well. If, as I suspect, the project of “building an interesting bridge between phenomenology and analytic philosophy and, thus, creating a new foundation that allows for an original perspective on central problems of philosophy” (as the publishers blurb says), remains a bit beyond our grasp, we still learn a great deal that we are not apt to learn elsewhere. And that may be better than that bridge.