Phenomenology, Logic, and the Philosophy of Mathematics

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Richard Tieszen, Phenomenology, Logic, and the Philosophy of Mathematics, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 368pp, $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521837820

Reviewed by Stephan Käufer, Franklin and Marshall College


This book collects fifteen essays and reviews that Tieszen has published in the past fifteen years. They are united by his overarching claim that the philosophy of mathematics has a lot to gain from taking Husserl's phenomenology seriously. With untiring dedication, Tieszen expounds Husserl's approach to cognition and brings it to bear on a range of basic problems in contemporary philosophy of mathematics, showing in each case how these problems can be dissolved by using the resources of transcendental phenomenology. Along the way he points out in a series of papers that Gödel came to endorse this kind of solution, and that it motivates some elements of intuitionism. Tieszen's dedication to Husserl combined with his sense for the technical side of the philosophy of mathematics makes his general picture of the possibilities of Husserlian phenomenology quite inviting, and I would hope that the efforts collected in this volume stimulate further discussion of phenomenology in the field.

Many problems in the philosophy of mathematics arise from the uncomfortable duality of mathematics considered as a system of relations among ideal objects and mathematics considered as a human activity. Such a dual characterization places facts about numbers and shapes at the intersection of necessity and psychology, an intersection whose very possibility some deny. Yet it is hard to avoid its appearance when we ask how we can cognitively relate to mathematical objects, what a mathematical proof is, and what kind of evidence leads us to affirm mathematical propositions. Tieszen uses questions like these to motivate a Husserlian approach.

Tieszen's conception of phenomenology is based on three central ideas that Husserl first develops in his Logical Investigations (1901). The most fundamental of these is the intentional structure of consciousness. All conscious acts have the structure of being directed at an object by way of the intentional content of the act. Husserl explains this directedness in terms of the fulfillment of an intended meaning. An intention can be empty, or it can be fulfilled if an objective correlate to the intention is given in the experience. This is most obviously the case in acts of visual perception, but Husserl crucially argues that not only perceptual, but also categorial aspects of the intended meaning can be fulfilled in experience. This third claim has the most far-reaching consequences for the philosophy of mathematics and logic. In "categorial intuition," Husserl argues, we can experience ideal entities, such as ideas, abstractions, sets, or numbers, by intuiting them. So, for instance, my experiences of trees may be of particular trees, of groups of trees, or of the ideal concept of a tree. In each case my act has a different intended meaning and is directed at a different object.

Husserl's decisive insight, which marks a deep distinction between his phenomenology and previous sense-data philosophy, is that ideal content is not an abstraction of given sensory particulars. Standing in front of a particular tree I may be consciously directed at the general idea of a tree, and that idea is itself given in my experience; it is not somehow added to or abstracted from an experience in which only the particular tree is properly given. There is, however, a type of dependency. The categorial act is founded on the perceptual act directed at the particular tree; it is a new way of experiencing the same tree and presumes the possibility of plain visual experience of the sensory object. However, in this new experience we are given a new intuitive content, an ideal content different from the sensory content that fulfills the perceptual intention. On the basis of this analysis, Husserl distinguishes sensory acts from "mixed" acts and purely categorial acts. Tieszen's Husserlian philosophy of mathematics rests on the latter kind: no sensory experience is involved in the fulfillment of mathematical intentions and yet something is given to us. Geometry is a possible exception to this, since Husserl argues, and Tieszen accepts, that geometric knowledge is founded on sensory experience of space (p. 83).

In his later Ideas for a Pure Phenomenology and Phenomenological Philosophy (1913), Husserl develops the method of eidetic variation. Eidetic variation consists of a series of mental acts that aim to grasp an invariant, ideal, non-sensory object that serves as a substrate to a range of experiences. The same object is given across this range of experience and we experience its self-samenesss. Husserl suggested that this method would serve to sharpen our conceptual grasp of ideal objects, and Tieszen argues that this method is in fact close to the actual procedure employed in modern geometry. In abstract sciences, Tieszen writes, "objectivity and invariance go hand in hand" (p. 89), and invariance is best understood as givenness. An ontology of abstract objects, then, should rest on the elements of Husserlian epistemology.

Husserl called his position "transcendental" phenomenology, and Tieszen makes sense of this by claiming that it can be seen as an extension of Kant's transcendental idealism. The act of cognition constitutes its content as objective. Once we recognize the distinctive givenness of essences in our experience, we can extend Kant's realism about empirical objects grounded in sensible intuition to a broader realism that encompasses objects grounded in categorial intuition, including mathematical objects.

The view is very much like what Kant has to say about empirical objects and empirical realism, except that now it is also applied to mathematical experience. On the object side of his analysis Husserl can still claim to be a kind of realist about mathematical objects, for mathematical objects are not our own ideas (p. 57f.).

This view, Tieszen points out, can preserve all the advantages of Platonism with none of its pitfalls. We can maintain that mathematical objects are mind-independent, self-subsistent and in every sense real, and we can also explain how we are cognitively related to them: they are invariants in our experience, given fulfillments of mathematical intentions. The evidence that justifies our mathematical knowledge is of the same kind as the evidence available for empirical knowledge claims: we are given these objects. And, since they are given, not subjectively constructed, fictionalism, conventionalism, and similar compromise views turn out to be unnecessarily permissive. The only twist we add to a Platonic realism is that ideal objects are transcendentally constituted.

We can evidently say, for example, that mathematical objects are mind-independent and unchanging, but now we always add that they are constituted in consciousness in this manner, or that they are constituted by consciousness as having this sense … . They are constituted in consciousness, nonarbitrarily, in such a way that it is unnecessary to their existence that there be expressions for them or that there ever be awareness of them. (p. 13).

A tempting view, indeed.

The obvious challenge to this Husserlian approach to the philosophy of mathematics turns out to be the strongest one. On first blush the solutions it offers are just too easy. How can we cognize numbers, sets, and mathematical facts? We intuit them. We intend them, and our intentions are fulfilled. Even if the phenomenologist can wiggle out of the difficulty that mathematicians may experience invariant objects that later turn out not to exist (did Frege intuit Russell sets?), one may well excuse the uninitiated to whom categorial intuition smacks of dormitive powers.

Invoking Kant's legacy does not meet such objections. Transcendental idealism is not easy to sell to an audience with solid realist leanings, and throwing abstract objects into the mix makes the task harder still. Phenomenology's difficulty lies in spelling out the details of categorial intuition. Tieszen knows well that Husserl himself takes this to be the core of his philosophical work. He quotes from volume 2 of the Logical Investigations:

What does it mean to say that an object exists both 'in itself' and 'given' in knowledge? How can the ideal nature of what is universal, [for example] a concept or a law, enter the stream of real mental events and become an item of knowledge for a thinking person? (p. 51).

The answer that Husserl painstakingly pursues is that the transcendental constitution of ideal objects is grounded in the structure of everyday experience, particularly perception. Tieszen mentions this, but does not pursue the question in great detail in this volume. On this important point the reader is somewhat frustrated by the lack of a continuous analysis that lies in the nature of a collection such as this one. In several chapters Tieszen repeats the outlines of intentionality (occasionally verbatim, e.g., pp. 51, 96, 156, 279) and thus manages to frame the problem in one context or another, but no single paper in the collection has the space to develop a detailed and in-depth answer to this type of objection.

The trouble is that Tieszen's Husserl must show that we can grasp ideal entities without being causally related to them or constructing them. Categorial intuition is an experience of invariant essences; receptive, but not sensible; formed by intentions, but not constructed. We can intend numbers or sets without constructing them, and we intuit them without the sets in any way causing this intuition. What, then, is intending and intuiting? How, if not causally or constructively, is the transcendental ego related to its intentional object? An answer is hard to imagine. For if the subject of the intentional act is conceived as a free-standing, pre-existing, representing consciousness and intentional content is conceived in terms of some element of a cognitive psychology, as ideas or concepts (as Tieszen conceives it, see, e.g., p. 52), then there seems to be no third alternative between causation and construction. A full consideration of intentionality has profound implications for a philosophical conception of the intentional subject, beyond what we may say about the objects constituted in the intentional act. Intentionality, in phenomenology, goes beyond the mere "aboutness" of consciousness that is now more or less a philosophical commonplace.

The solution may lie in conceiving of an intentional subject that itself comes to be constituted in intentionality, no longer conceived as a cognitive subject-object relation. I believe that some progress towards such a solution has been made in post-Husserlian phenomenology, beginning with Heidegger. Tieszen is understandably weary of this tradition. Husserl's work was eclipsed by Heidegger's existential phenomenology, and the existential turn of philosophy that began with Heidegger's Being and Time made phenomenology in general seem less relevant to the concerns of logic and philosophy of mathematics in the analytic tradition. Part of Tieszen's strategy to motivate discussion of Husserl among contemporary philosophers of logic and mathematics is to associate Husserlian phenomenology with analytically respectable authors such as Carnap and Gödel and, at the same time, to disavow a genuine continuity from Husserl to Heidegger. Further, Tieszen seems to think that Heidegger's analytic of Dasein somehow "naturalizes" or "psychologizes" categorial intuition (p. 130). This reluctance to really overcome the perceived division between analytic and continental philosophy strikes me as a vulnerability of Tieszen's approach. The opportunities for further study in this direction are even vaster than Tieszen here suggests, and it is to be hoped that this collection of essays will lead others to explore them.