Phenomenology of Perception

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Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Phenomenology of Perception, Donald A. Landes (tr.), Routledge, 2012. 606pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415558693.


Reviewed by Eran Dorfman, Freie Universität Berlin


Sixty-seven years after its publication in French and fifty years after its first translation into English, the long-awaited new translation of Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology of Perception has finally come out. This classical work famously grounds experience in the body, showing how the latter conditions perception and action in various domains such as spatiality, temporality, language and otherness. Merleau-Ponty's work, however, has been accused of many flaws in the last half-century: it would alternately be called a dull imitation of Husserl and/or Heidegger, a symmetrically opposed reproduction of Sartre's Being and Nothingness, a conservative philosophy of the "subject" or finally an outdated attempt to deal with contemporary science. Nonetheless, Phenomenology of Perception has survived all these accusations, and this new translation proves its contemporary relevance, which continues to grow. The work seems to have a discrete yet long-lasting power that keeps inspiring new generations of scholars and practitioners from various and sometimes opposed traditions and disciplines. What is the secret of Phenomenology of Perception which attracts its reader despite the efforts it demands?

A hint can be found in its preface, where Merleau-Ponty claims that even if it is possible to criticize phenomenology as a myth or a fad, it must be admitted that "phenomenology allows itself to be practiced and recognized as a manner or a style, or that it exists as a movement, prior to having reached a full philosophical consciousness" (p. xxi). This phrase, I believe, characterizes first and foremost Phenomenology of Perception itself, which does much more than describe perception: it actually engages in the movement of perception itself and realizes it in a unique manner and style. Moreover, the multiple movements of Phenomenology of Perception are stretched between various poles, aspects and attitudes; I will discuss four of these.

1.     A movement between the transcendental and the empirical

The transcendental is the formal level of purified subject and its correlate perception, whereas the empirical is the level employed on the one hand by science that describes the subject of perception, and on the other hand by the subject itself, when it spontaneously acts in the natural attitude. Whereas Husserl had initially aimed at reaching the transcendental level through the famous procedure of the phenomenological reduction, and only later admitted the difficulty of doing so and the consequent need to develop other modes of reduction, Merleau-Ponty recognizes from the start the danger of pretending to immediately arrive at the transcendental level:

A philosophy becomes transcendental, that is, radical, not by taking up a position within absolute consciousness while failing to mention the steps that carried it there, but rather as considering itself as a problem; not by assuming the total making-explicit of knowledge, but rather by recognizing this presumption of reason as the fundamental philosophical problem (p. 64).

This presumption of reason and philosophy occupies Merleau-Ponty throughout, but interestingly he finds the same presumption in perception itself, when it is effected by the natural or naturalistic attitude. The latter tends not to recognize its own impact on the objects of perception and consequently rigidifies these objects and also rigidifies itself. Merleau-Ponty's solution to this presumption both on the level of philosophy and of perception is to preserve a movement between these two levels, so that the natural attitude is reminded of its own force and the transcendental attitude is reminded that it is not absolute and always depends on empirical perception. Indeed, Merleau-Ponty tries to find a mediator between these two poles, which he locates in the phenomenal level, but this remains rather obscure; the only way to attain it seems to be through the movement between the two extreme poles.

2.     A movement between intellectualism and empiricism

Merleau-Ponty analyzes the intellectualist (subjectivist-idealist) and the empiricist (objectivist-realist) attitudes in practically every chapter of the book. He incessantly shows the impasses and the insufficiencies of both, thus preparing the ground for a third perspective, that is, the phenomenological one. However, this movement is often misunderstood, since Merleau-Ponty employs it in his unique style which consists of adopting the first-person perspective of each of these attitudes -- describing them from the eyes of their beholders. We are thus repeatedly confronted with two rather strange subjects: one who believes that everything he or she perceives is "inside" and the other who believes that it is rather "outside;" yet each eventually reaches a deadlock.

Thus, the hasty reader may confuse these perspectives with those of Merleau-Ponty, but the attempt to avoid this may embed an even greater interpretative mistake, shared by many commentators. Such a reading forgets that the "mistaken" attitudes nonetheless hold a core of truth and cannot be simply dismissed. It would thus be a complete misunderstanding to try to extract Merleau-Ponty's "real" ideas, filtering and putting aside the tedious descriptions of "mistaken" perceptions. The whole endeavor of Phenomenology of Perception is not to make these disappear, but rather to move between them, thus exemplifying and realizing all the facets of perception: it is neither in the subject nor in the object, but between the two. Indeed, perception sometimes tends to get "stuck" at one of its poles. Phenomenology’s task, however, is not to condemn the consequent subjectivism or objectivism, but rather to show how together they form a spectrum which discerns the limits of perception.

3.     A movement between the normal and the pathological

The empirical perception described by Merleau-Ponty is often derived from scientific experiments and observations, yet it is noteworthy that most of them concern pathological cases. Merleau-Ponty is aware of this problem and says: "It cannot be a question of simply transferring to the normal person what is missing in the patient and what he is trying to recover" (p. 110). However, he does not always follow this rule. For example, he characterizes the pathology of the brain-damaged patient Schneider and similar cases as a loss of what he calls the "function of projection": "The world no longer exists for these patients except as a ready-made or fixed world, whereas the normal person's projects polarize the world, causing a thousand signs to appear there, as if by magic, that guide action, as signs in a museum guide the visitor" (p. 115). The function of projection consists of transcending the actual with the help of the possible, thus enabling creation and renewal. But do all "normal" persons share the same capacity of creation?

Merleau-Ponty opens and closes the book with a definition of "true philosophy," saying first that it entails "learning to see the world anew" (p. xxxv), and concluding with its function, which is "to teach us to see [things and historical situations] anew" (p. 483). The French origin uses the same verb, rapprendre, which both means to re-learn and to re-teach, and it seems that Phenomenology of Perception tries to realize the process of learning/teaching to perceive anew by moving from a static perception of ready-made objects towards a more dynamic perception which creates and re-creates its objects. But this implies that the pathological and the normal alike should merely be seen as extreme poles: pathology representing a completely static or "blocked" perception, as in Schneider's case, and normality standing for rich and creative perception, which is more an ideal than an everyday reality. Real perception is thus never completely "normal" and is rather summoned to engage itself in the infinite process of learning and re-learning to perceive.

4.     A movement between the pre-objective and the objective

Merleau-Ponty develops the idea of "radical reflection" which does not forget its own effect upon the objects and its capacity to change their perception from within. The last chapter of Phenomenology of Perception, entitled "Freedom," puts forward Marx's idea that "philosophy actualizes itself by destroying itself as an isolated philosophy" (p. 483), implying that phenomenology itself can becomes a part of life, teaching a way to realize one own's freedom by grounding it in the human body as a pre-objective layer of perception and action.

However, it is crucial to note that this pre-objective layer, which has fascinated many scholars and which has been further developed in Merleau-Ponty's posthumous The Visible and the Invisible, is always conditioned by a process of objectification, if only because it is reflected upon by the philosopher himself. Merleau-Ponty is not a naïve idealist, believing in a pure primordial layer which would ground the "ulterior" ones, as some contemporary thinkers interpret him. Rather, every description of the body as pre-objective is always complemented by a description of the same body as objective or objectified. It is true that this objectification is sometimes attributed to science or to pathology, and yet, as I have argued, science and pathology are not external to perception but are rather necessary poles demarcating a wide spectrum. The body is never completely pre-objective nor completely objective, but instead moves between these two aspects. It is precisely this constant movement which Merleau-Ponty names ambiguity.

The ambiguity of the body is actually present in all the points which I have mentioned, that is, in all the movements deployed between the different poles. Perception has in every given moment at least two facets which have multiple names (and to add a few more: constituting and constituted, subjective and objective, speaking and spoken). Merleau-Ponty tirelessly describes these facets in order to attain a multi-layered perception which would maintain the movement of ambiguity. In this way he hopes to fight against both the philosophical and the everyday tendency to stop and consider only restricted aspects of the world and of perception, believing that these are the true and only ones. The challenge of the reader of Phenomenology of Perception is to continue this ambiguous movement and to accept the sometime unusual style of the work, which tries to echo the ambiguity of perception itself.

If this book is quite challenging for the reader, this is true a fortiori for the translator. It is thus pleasing to note that this new translation has succeeded in rendering the text clearer and more fluid than the previous translation, thereby, paradoxically, helping to make its ambiguous movement more approachable. The translator's efforts to make the work accessible never oversimplify Merleau-Ponty's complicated phrases, and he is careful not to distort Merleau-Ponty's original ideas. Moreover, the translation introduces some helpful elements such as additional subtitles which are taken from the original French table of contents, a sensitive division of the text into themed paragraphs, and knowledgable endnotes.

It is often due to feelings of confusion and lack of clarity that one seeks to avoid ambiguity. This new translation, which is accurate, sensitive and eloquent, will, I hope, enable the reader to better deal with the inaccuracy, opacity and rigidity which are part of any perception and of any text. It will enable the reader to use this "negativity" -- which Merleau-Ponty names "incompleteness" -- as a motor for re-appropriation and continuation of the text. If this new translation of Phenomenology of Perception achieves this task, it will do what any translation secretly wishes: to simultaneously accomplish and renew the original endeavor of the author.