Phenomenology of Plurality: Hannah Arendt on Political Intersubjectivity

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Sophie Loidolt, Phenomenology of Plurality: Hannah Arendt on Political Intersubjectivity, Routledge, 2018, 290pp., $140.00, ISBN: 9781138631892.

Reviewed by Robert Sinnerbrink, Macquarie University


Sophie Loidolt's book is timely and impressive. It makes a significant contribution to the critical reception of Arendt's work, not only as a political philosopher but also as a member of the second wave of phenomenological thinkers (such as Merleau-Ponty and Sartre) who brought insights from 'classical' phenomenology (Husserl and Heidegger) to a range of ethical and political concerns. Loidolt's task is twofold: to rescue Arendt from critical theory and poststructuralist critiques, and to show how Arendt's work offers a phenomenologically grounded account of plurality, intersubjectivity, and politics. Her book is a great example of reconstructive critical interpretation that challenges prevailing interpretations and develops anew Arendt's phenomenological approach to political intersubjectivity.

The book has two parts: the first presents the case for Arendt as (political) phenomenologist, focusing on the key concepts of plurality, appearance, experience, and world, and offering an account of Arendt's phenomenological methodology; the second elaborates the Arendtian idea of 'actualizing plurality', focusing on her phenomenological account of plurality as political intersubjectivity, and examining Arendt's approach to actualizing a plural sense of the 'we'. The final chapter, which offers a spirited defense of Arendt's alleged lack of 'moral foundations', turns more comparative and speculative, exploring what Loidolt calls the 'intrinsic ethics' to be found in Arendt's notion of actualized plurality. She also offers an intriguing comparison between Levinas's ethics of alterity and Arendt's politics of plurality, suggesting that Arendt's political phenomenology could benefit from Levinasian ethical insights, while Levinas's thinking regarding politics could be strengthened via Arendt (although radical differences between Arendtian politics and Levinasian ethics still loom large). Loidolt's research is impeccably thorough and her book is well written. She makes a convincing case for reconsidering Arendt's work as political phenomenology. As I suggest below, there are some critical questions left unanswered, but the rigor and clarity of her critical reappraisal of Arendt as political phenomenologist are beyond question.

In her Introduction, Loidolt presents Arendt as a philosophical outsider who always eluded categorization but nonetheless belongs within the family of phenomenological thinkers. Arendt's breakthrough idea, that of plurality, not only motivated her own thinking about the nature of the political but also prompted her to re-think the traditions of philosophy from which she came. The 'paradigm of plurality' introduced the political into philosophical thought, but also convinced Arendt that traditional political philosophy lacked the resources to think human plurality, since it remained focused 'on the "essence of man" in the singular' (2). Loidolt's central claim is that this key concept in Arendt's work -- typically understood to refer to the sheer fact of human diversity -- is to be understood in a phenomenological context in relation to human action within a shared world: 'Plurality is not something that simply is, but essentially something we have to take up and do. Therefore, it manifests itself only as an actualization of plurality in a space of appearances' (2).

This encapsulates, for Loidolt, the 'core phenomenon' of Arendt's political thinking and provides the basis of her interpretation of Arendt as a political phenomenologist. She defends this approach as philosophical, given the tendency in much Arendt scholarship to emphasize 'the political' (drawing on Arendt's own separation of philosophy and political theory). Indeed, the philosophical task of explicating the meaning of 'plurality', she argues, reveals a rich transformation of phenomenological method and concepts in Arendt's work. Such an approach challenges both the assumed primacy of theoria (rather than praxis) in much phenomenological research, and contributes to social ontology a political notion of the 'space of appearance' (3) where social interactions take place. Taking her cue from Adriana Cavavero, Loidolt develops a radical phenomenology by way of an autonomous or 'explicit phenomenology of plurality' (6) -- her main contribution to Arendt scholarship, and to phenomenological theory more generally.

Her interpretation proceeds through a careful analysis of the cognate phenomenological concepts of action, appearance, intersubjectivity, experience, and world. Loidolt shows that the implications of human plurality -- meaning the plurality of perspectival approaches to a shared world defined by intersubjective webs of human relationships -- remain under-explored even today. Extending the claims of Existenz philosophy (Jaspers) concerning human existence, but supplementing it via Heidegger's notion of being-with others in the world, Arendt's concept of plural existence takes on a major role in the constitution of (social) reality, which rejects the isolated self confronting the world and begins with the fundamental 'withness' of our shared being-in-the-world. Heidegger's account of inauthentic everyday Dasein (being-there) has to be expanded via a conception of originary intersubjectivity that both opens up a shared world and articulates the plurality of individual perspectives on that world. Instead of an isolated authentic existence, Arendt begins with the intersubjective experience of a plural encounter with others, one that emphasizes both possibility and communication. The philosophical task now becomes that of rethinking the with-world, shifting from the dialogical I-thou relationship to the intersubjective Being-with relationship as constitutive of our experience. This also means shifting our attention philosophically to the spheres of politics and action (rather than theory), which means subjecting the realm of human plurality or the with-world to phenomenological inquiry, while maintaining a sense of philosophical wonder (thaumazein) towards the 'realm of human affairs' (45-46). The book as a whole will then elaborate the fruits of these insights, developing the thesis that Arendt's phenomenology of plurality provides the basis of a political thinking oriented towards freedom understood as 'actualizing plurality within a space of appearances' (51).

Loidolt then turns to explicating and 'politicizing' -- in the sense of rendering applicable to the Arendtian sphere of the political -- the three operative concepts of appearance, experience, and world. Here the Husserlian and Heideggerian background of Arendt's thinking comes to the fore. The concept of 'appearance' is indebted to Heidegger's phenomenological analysis of this phenomenon in Being and Time (59-63); this phenomenological notion is then 'pluralized' by referring the space of appearance to the intersubjective realm opened up by a plurality of first-person perspectival disclosures of our shared being-in-the-world. Moreover, to be a self means to appear in such a plural space of appearances, and to disclose who one is by way of speech and action in relation to others. The concept of experience, in turn, is indebted to hermeneutics in Heidegger's sense of the understanding and interpretation of phenomena encountered within a shared world. The early Heidegger's 'hermeneutics of facticity' is thus transposed to a pluralized realm of the (political) space of appearances in which individuality is actualized by speech and action -- precisely what Arendt regards as threatened in modernity by the rise of 'the social' and the diminution of politics. As for the concept of 'world', which Loidolt describes as central to Arendt's thinking, it also draws on a phenomenological heritage (principally Heidegger). Loidolt emphasizes in particular Heidegger's conception of the with-world [Mitsein] and the idea of an in-between, which Arendt radically transforms 'by thinking world worldliness in relation to actualized plurality and thus, the political' (96).

Loidolt also underlines the importance of Arendt's phenomenological methodology, which departs from 'classical' phenomenology as a 'descriptive science' of consciousness (Husserl) or an 'existential analytic' of human beings understood as Dasein (or being-there) (Heidegger). Instead, Arendt focuses on human action within the space of appearances: 'activities that enact conditional structures' (110) which provide the basic (worldly, bodily, intersubjective) conditions for the actualization of plurality, and hence for the constitution and building of a shared (human) world. As is well known, for Arendt the three fundamental human activities that provide the conditions for human forms of life are labor (our active metabolism with nature), work (the realm of economic and social activity), and action (pluralized communications and intersubjectively mediated performances within spaces of appearance). Of these three, it is human action that provides the focus for Arendt's political phenomenology, since the realm of labor (life and nature) and of work (social and economic activity) remain separate from the realm of politics proper.

There are, of course, numerous criticisms of Arendt's model of 'the human condition'. There is first the charge that the separation of labor and work is untenable, since our relationship with nature is implicated in our economic and social activity and our economic and social activity extends to the 'private' spheres of the family, sexual reproduction, and social relationships).  Critics also claim that the social and political are not as opposed in modernity as Arendt contends: the social and the political are linked in complex modern societies, and the social and economic institutions of modern polities are themselves essential arenas of institutionalized political action.  And some maintain that her notion of 'the political' persists in identifying a 'classical' conception of political action -- reserved for autonomous citizens free of the burdens of labor and able to transcend the sphere of work -- that is historically anachronistic, culturally specific, and normatively inappropriate when applied to modernity. One of the major tasks of Loidoit's study is to counter such critiques, and to offer an original, transformed account of Arendtian political phenomenology capable of addressing these difficulties. In some instances, such as her refutation of Seyla Benhabib's vague charge of 'phenomenological essentialism', this defense is convincing; in others, such as her attempt to rehabilitate Arendt's theses on the autonomy of the political, or the need to keep truth out of the pluralized sphere of politics, her claims are less persuasive, as I remark in conclusion.

Part I of the book considers the phenomenon of actualized plurality, articulating how individuals realize themselves through enactive performance in a worldly 'appearance-space', and how human activities and 'visibilities' intertwine to 'create differently shaped spaces of meaning' (151). Part II turns to the phenomenon of 'actualizing plurality' itself, understood as a plurality of subjectivities actualizing their individuality via speech and action enacted within shared spaces of political intersubjectivity. Plurality, for Loidolt, does not refer to the mere empirical fact of a diversity of human types or traits; rather, it refers to the manner in which the 'irreducible uniqueness' of each individual is realized within spaces of appearance, forming a collective 'we' that depends upon the expression of unique individuality. Any forms of social-economic life (work) that exclude the actualization of plurality are therefore inimical to human freedom; conversely, social and political arrangements that foster the actualization of human plurality with organized spaces of meaning are to be valorized as furthering human freedom.

Arendt famously claimed that modernity is defined by the collapse of fully-fledged human forms of experience thanks to the 'rise of the social' (dominated by a logic of life/labor and a utilitarian logic of socio-economic work) that eclipses the possibility of genuine speech and action within the political sphere of appearance (or other cultural spaces of meaning). For Loidolt, Arendt's true political philosophy both launches a critique of the tendencies in modernity that are destructive of the realization of human freedom, and offers an alternative model of a revitalized politics that would promote human freedom understood as the actualization of plurality. Again, Loidolt goes to great lengths to demonstrate the phenomenological background (chiefly Husserl and Heidegger) to Arendt's conception of politics as actualized plurality within spaces of appearance. She also uses this phenomenological conception of plurality -- and the idea of actualizing a plural sense of the 'we' -- to counter two critical tendencies in recent Arendt scholarship: the critique of Arendt's alleged 'phenomenological essentialism' (Benhabib), which relies on a straw man version of phenomenology; and the critique of Arendt's anachronistic conception of politics (modeled on the Greek sense of an agon between free citizens within a circumscribed polis). Loidolt challenges the latter for its inadequate account of Arendt's 'modernity' in recognizing the potentials for realizing freedom in the modern world. To be sure, Arendt does criticize the dominance of the logic of socio-economic management as undermining the freedom-actualizing potentialities of political 'spaces of meaning', but she also claims that these are precisely what should be preserved as an antidote to the 'totalitarian' tendencies of both capitalist and communist forms of life.

Another important way in which individuals might realize themselves and enact their freedom within modernity is via communication understood as a means of actualizing plurality through speech within intersubjective contexts of meaning. Both speech and action, in these senses, are intimately linked with the third Arendtian aspect of human freedom, namely the capacity of making a new beginning or initiating natality (as a counterpoint to the traditional phenomenological emphasis on mortality).

Finally, Loidolt underlines the importance of 'judging' as a way in which individuals can actualize plurality and thereby express their freedom within culture and politics. Here she draws on a radicalized version of Kant's model of aesthetic 'reflective judgment' (singular judgments made on the basis of subjective experience, rather than pre-given norms or laws, that nonetheless carry a 'universal' claim). Arendt modifies reflective judgment as part of the intersubjective 'enlargement of mentality' required for us to deal with value disputations and a diversity of opinions within cultural and political spheres. Together, the three aspects of speech, action, and judging contribute to the actualization of human plurality in ways conducive to freedom, enabling the formation of a genuine political community defined by a plural sense of the 'we' that requires, rather than suppresses, the expression of individuality.

In her final chapter, on the political ethics of actualized plurality, Loidolt addresses criticisms of Arendt 'inspired by the Frankfurt school' (233) and elaborates the 'implicit ethics' in Arendt's political thinking that many critics have claimed is lacking. She also challenges theorists who emphasize an 'antagonistic' model of politics and reject the inclusion of the ethical as part of politics (such as Laclau and Mouffe and Jacques Rancière), arguing for a more ethical 'agonistic' politics that does not take dissensus or conflict as paradigmatic of 'the political' as such. The implicit ethics in Arendt's account of actualized plurality, according to Loidolt, involves 'freedom, trust, and sociability' as 'proto-normative' principles that create a space of meaning in which normative moral questions and debates can acquire relevance (234). Arendt's emphasis on the Socratic morality of 'conscience based on our ability to think' is also crucial, as are the importance of 'self-limitation' and 'protecting' spheres of meaning in which individuals can actualize their freedom through speech and action (234-235).

Loidolt uses the metaphor of 'making music' together (like jazz improvisation) to articulate this Arendtian ethical vision of a 'we' that preserves individuality while acknowledging an implicit ethical engagement with others that enables the successful realization of freedom (235-236). Unlike orchestral musical performance following a musical script (or team sports performance), the freedom of expression intrinsic to the improvisatory ensemble, for Loidolt, better reflects the kind of implicit ethics of actualizing plurality. Critics of Arendt, however, may not be persuaded by this analogy: improvisatory performance requires a level of skill and expertise that few musicians can attain, and achieves aesthetic success in the absence of explicit norms (e.g. musical scores) thanks only to the mastery and improvisational know-how of elite players. As a model of the implicit ethics underlying political action, this metaphor still connotes some of the worries about anti-democratic elitism and lack of normative foundations that dog Arendt's 'aestheticized' conception of politics.

Loidolt acknowledges that the political -- the 'space created by action and plurality' -- remains a 'turbulent and fragile space' (236) but defends Arendt's insistence on 'great deeds' that 'achieve the extraordinary' (237) as paradigmatic of politics. She tempers the 'Greek'-heroic resonances of Arendt's politics, however, with an emphasis on 'webs of relationships' within social interaction and the ethical importance of 'forgiving and promising' in dealing with the possibility of failure and thus ensuring the conditions enabling a 'new beginning'. But it is far from clear whether the general ethic of 'welcoming the new, keeping one's promises, and being ready to forgive' (241) is adequate to the social and political challenges facing democratic societies today. This is especially relevant when dealing with economic, geopolitical, and environmental issues that are systemic, global, and complex in nature (e.g. economic exploitation, racism, sexism, and other forms of discrimination, global inequalities in wealth, historical injustices, the plight of refugees and asylum seekers, environmental destruction/climate change threats, and so on).

Another issue that contemporary critics might find troubling in Arendt -- considering recent worries about the 'post-truth' world and the discursive prevalence of Frankfurtian 'bullshit' or indifference towards truth and falsity -- concerns her rejection of truth claims as relevant normative criteria within the sphere of politics (241 ff.). The power of rational argumentation and the coercive adverting to facts were taken by Arendt to pose threats to the space of diverse opinion defining the political sphere. Although Loidolt acknowledges that Arendt can be faulted for a reductive account of truth (247), her claim that truth remains incompatible with plurality raises serious questions, especially in a political context where truth is sometimes regarded as a convenient fiction ("alternative facts") and rational argumentation and scientific evidence are frequently dismissed as expressing vested interests or conspiratorial lies (e.g. climate change denialism). Indeed, one could make the argument that truth (rational argumentation and scientific evidence) remains an important contributor to defending spaces of meaning that have social, cultural, as well as political relevance, and that plurality thrives on disputation, provided there are norms of communicative interaction that enable argument and debate to be conducted in a meaningful manner. Norms of communicative rationality could be an ally, rather than an enemy, of practices that contribute to the cultivation of plurality and hence to political flourishing.

These critical remarks do not detract, however, from the impressive achievements of Loidolt's book, which offers one of the most original and compelling interpretations of Arendt's philosophical thinking in recent decades. Readers approaching it in a philosophical spirit will be rewarded with a rich understanding of Arendt's work as a political phenomenology that can still teach us much about the 'human condition' today.