Phenomenology of the Human Person

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Robert Sokolowski, Phenomenology of the Human Person, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 345pp., $26.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521717663.

Reviewed by Lilian Alweiss, Trinity College Dublin


When Sokolowski raises the question of what is distinctive about the human person, he touches upon a theme that has troubled philosophy ever since its inception. Whether the answer is that we have a capacity to reason or speak (Aristotle), that we are not merely conscious but self-conscious beings (Kant), that we are free (Rousseau) or that we live with an understanding of Being (Heidegger), all these thinkers believe that the question is essential, as it allows us not only to understand what it means to be a human being and what kind of life we should be living but, moreover, what it means to do philosophy.

This comes to light in Sokolowski's book Phenomenology of the Human Person which provides a blend of erudite scholarly discussion of notably Aristotle and Husserl, as well as contemporary linguistic theory and recent developments of neuroscience. The topic is classical through and through, yet the approach is refreshingly modern and original. The classical theme that weaves its way through the book is the claim that what makes us distinct is that we are philosophical insofar as we are agents of truth. To be an agent of truth according to Sokolowski is synonymous with being what Aristotle calls a 'rational animal'. We are told that the pursuit of truth is not simply a choice that some of us happen to take up while others don't, but it is a choice that determines whether we are able to realize ourselves fully as human beings or not. The desire for truth as such, Sokolowski calls it veracity, is something that pertains to our nature. 'It is very deep in us, more basic than any particular desire or emotion, more elementary than any particular attempt to find things out, and more fundamental than any act of telling the truth to others. We are made human by it, and it is there in us to be developed well or badly' (21). Veracity is not a choice. We could say it is a predisposition that we can either actualise or not. Failing to do so results in the failure of being a fully fledged human being which must ultimately lead to unhappiness. As he observes: 'we can be happy as human beings only by cultivating our veracity into truthfulness' (21).

Sokolowski clearly rehearses classical themes. However, what marks out his approach is that he does not treat them in an antiquated, but in an analytically refreshingly modern way. For to arrive at these conclusions, Sokolowski realizes that he must first account for how we actually become agents of truth and it is this question that forms the core of the book. We learn that the capacity of speech -- syntax in language, thought and, indeed, pictorial images -- plays a key role in the attainment of truth. Here are some of the key features he presents: Drawing on the work of the linguist Derek Bickerton, he distinguishes protolanguage from human language. Protolanguage such as animal cries or baby talk only has a semantics insofar as it 'names' things, but lacks the additional syntax of human language. With the introduction of syntax we come to use indexical expressions and thus no longer just think or express things but take responsibility for our thoughts. In a word, we become agents of truth. Conversely, by using quotation marks we are able to 'disappropriate what we are about to say' (75). Since syntactical discussion of things goes beyond the continuity of perception and constitutes states of affairs, we can investigate the truth and correctness of what has been said. Syntax makes it possible for us to refer to things that are absent. This facilitates pictorial thinking and abstract thought. Furthermore, by means of syntax we can draw distinctions between what is essential and what is accidental and thereby we can explore the true nature of things. Animals that only have the capacity of protolanguage cannot do any of these things. That is why Sokolowski believes that only we humans are singled out as agents of truth.

To arrive at these conclusions Sokolowski takes his inspiration from Husserl's work on syntax (categoriality). He believes that Husserl provides the resources to 'transcend the differences between ancients and moderns' (273). One important aspect of Husserl's work is that it allows us to understand the role of predication without drawing on conceptions such as an inner life or soul. Husserl makes us realize that when we say something about something, we are actually referring to something objective. This is not to say that syntactic components of language and thought have an objective correlate in the things perceived, rather the claim is that syntactical composition in all its forms -- be it verbal, pictorial or practical -- manifests itself in the public domain. 'The words we speak express the things we talk about' (173) and not something in the head.

Although Sokolowski draws on Husserl to develop this claim, he believes that we need to go beyond Husserl if we really wish to overcome the language of mental representation. The problem is that Husserl still treats the noetic side of experience (the act of thinking, judging, etc.) by focusing on the individual or solitary mind and thereby does not seem to realize that it is public discourse that gives us vocabulary, images and syntax. We never deal with the solitary thought and its object 'but our spoken words, as well as the thoughtful articulation associated with them, occur first and foremost between interlocutors' (58). In the same way as logical form is intersubjectively constituted, so is our act of thinking. In a word, to overcome the language of 'mentalese' we need to realize that the intersubjective dimension goes -- so to speak -- all the way down.

However, apart from the passages in Husserl's early work, the Logical Investigations, cited by Sokolowski which refer to expressions in solitary mental life, I very much doubt that he actually failed to realize the importance of the intersubjective realm. At least in his later writings Husserl is at pains to emphasise that we only arrive at a meaningful conception of the self intersubjectively. As Husserl points out: 'The I has its peculiar ownness in the Thou and is only constituted in contrast to it.'[1] Sokolowski rightly observes that Husserl does not focus on the role of human conversation when he describes the noetic act of thinking, however this in itself in no way proves that he regards the subject monologically. It may simply prove that Husserl's focus is more on the role of perception and not on the role of human conversation.

Considering that the public aspect of both thought and language and, in particular, human conversation, plays a key role in Sokolowski's book, I am surprised that he hardly made any reference to Wittgenstein or indeed contemporary debates in the philosophy of language (his main inspiration is the work of Michael Oakshott). I wonder whether this is because his life-long work has focused mainly on ancient philosophy and phenomenology, or whether there is some deeper reason. My suspicion is the latter because there are aspects of Wittgenstein's philosophy that Sokolowski probably would not wish to endorse; one being the view that truth is a social construct or at least not absolute. Although Sokolowski does not explain how he understands the nature of truth (which is surprising considering that the entire book is about veracity), he does seem to indicate that he wishes to hold fast to a substantial notion of truth. When Sokolowski argues that Husserl provides a bridge between the ancients and the moderns, I take it that he believes that Husserl confirms Aquinas' contention that "truth is the conformity of the mind with reality" since he equally claims that thought has a direct or immediate relation to its object. However, by focusing on the role of human conversation, Sokolowski must realize that the nature of truth is quite different. Husserl realized as much. His entire later work focuses on the role intersubjectivity plays in the constitution of knowledge and truth: Truth not only lies in the public domain, it is, moreover, intersubjectively constituted -- a claim Husserl seems to be comfortable with, but one which I am not sure Sokolowski would endorse considering that it puts into peril his entire endeavour to allow for the transition from ancient to modern thought.

I am aware that I have hardly scratched the surface of this incredibly rich and suggestive book. The book is a labour of love bringing together material drawn from a lifetime of devoted teaching and writing. Sokolowski clearly shows why we ought not to read Aristotle and Aquinas merely as historical phenomena but as thinkers who provide us with 'material for recapitulation' (273). Against the trend of specialization, it tries to show how philosophical questions are not limited to a specific discipline but address all spheres of life. To this extent the book is a truly philosophical work which is rare to find. At the end of his book Sokolowski observes:

a philosophical book, unlike a novel, is a conversation. The philosopher seeks omniscience while being only too keenly aware of his ignorance, and the philosophical reader does not simply listen and follow, but continuously evaluates and responds as he thinks on his own. (322)

The book's passionate defence of truth and suggestive rereading of ancient themes from a modern perspective undoubtedly achieves precisely this -- a passionate engagement with philosophy as such.

[1] Edmund Husserl (1973): Husserliana Vol. 13. Zur Phänomenologie der Intersubjektivität I. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.