Philosophers at the Front: Phenomenology and the First World War

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Nicolas de Warren and Thomas Vongehr (eds.), Philosophers at the Front: Phenomenology and the First World War, Leuven University Press, 2017, 284pp., $59.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789462701212.

Reviewed by James Dodd, The New School for Social Research


This volume collates a wealth of literary and photographic materials documenting the war experience of the generation of phenomenological philosophers that lived through the First World War. As the editors express it in their Introduction, they have sought to "document the texture of the life-world of phenomenology during the war years" of 1914-1918, with some echoes from its immediate aftermath (8). Their work is based on an exhibition curated by Clara Drummond for the KU Leuven Central Library in 2015, "From Ashes to Archives," and consists of letters private and public, postcards, photographs, and excerpts from biographies and war literature.

Edmund Husserl and his family figure prominently in the volume. The editors emphasize, significantly, the contemporary perception among German intellectuals of playing an important role in the articulation of the national and spiritual meaning of the war, and Husserl was no exception (6). Husserl's contribution begins as a signatory of a petition protesting the perceived calumny of press representations of German conduct in Belgium in the opening weeks of the conflict. Husserl's public interventions such as this remain modest but consistent throughout the war, and culminate in the lectures delivered in 1917/18 on "Fichte's Ideal of Humanity," for which he was awarded a Prussian Service Cross for War Assistance in April of 1918 (38-39).

The public statement signed by Husserl in October 1914, "Declaration of the Professors from the Universities and Technical Colleges of the German Empire" (20-21), with its prickly defense of German militarism, makes for difficult reading over a century later. It is difficult to dismiss offhand, especially when one surveys the intellectual power represented collectively by the signatories (including David Hilbert, whose name appears next to Husserl's). This petition appeared two weeks after the more infamous "An die Kulturwelt!," signed by ninety-three leading artists, scientists, and academics, including the Nobel Prize winning philosopher Rudolf Eucken.[1] Both petitions were in painfully defensive response to the virtually universal international outrage at the destruction of the city of Leuven (including the university library mentioned above) in August of 1914.

These two petitions are often cited as evidence of either war hysteria or the wholesale failure of the German intellectual elite to provide moral guidance in a time of national emergency. Yet such assessments of momentary insanity or moral indifference tend to belie the evident force of the sentiment behind such actions, not to mention its complexity -- easy to do when adducing evidence from often rather turgid public statements of protest. Both the genuineness of sentiment and the sense of its complexity are expressed in a more philosophical passage from a letter by Husserl to an unknown correspondent at the end of 1914:

People here become closer with each other, the all-too human element, which separated people, melts away, a community of sympathy, a community of pride, and a common will, in short, a living sociality is present here to such a degree and tied together with such intensity, as one could not have suspected and believed to be possible. That is the effect of 'militarism,' that is the effect of the war … (24)

The philosopher Edith Stein, who served as a nurse throughout the war and would later be Husserl's assistant in Freiburg, expresses a very similar perspective in a letter to Roman Ingarden from 1917, in which she recounts how the outbreak of the war instilled in her a profound sense of dedication not only to the German nation, but even to the German state: "today [day of mobilization in 1914] my individual life ceased, and everything who I am belongs to the state. Should I survive the war, I would then want to begin my life anew based on this conviction" (229). What impressed her was the sheer enormity of the effort, the sense that historical stakes were high and the demand for sacrifice unprecedented. In many this brought a sense of deep foreboding; in others it liberated and sanctioned an idealism that seemed to have finally found its moment. The latter response is expressed by Karl Löwith in his autobiography "Mein Leben":

The urge for emancipation from the bourgeois confines of school and home, . . . the charm of the 'dangerous life' for which Nietzsche had inspired us, the desire to throw oneself into adventure, and not least of all, the release of one's own existence . . . these and comparable motivations determined me to welcome the war as a chance of life and death. (188)

Interwoven with such idealism was a national pride, often wounded, that waxed in turns defensive and acerbic. The Husserls in particular expressed deep disappointment in an America which, even during its initial neutrality, provided material support for the enemy. In an open public letter to Hugo Münsterberg (at the time visiting Harvard) in 1915, published under the title "Peace in America," Husserl vents his disappointment in a paradoxical effort to try to promote sympathy for Germany (28). Husserl expresses this animus consistently, so for example in a 1915 letter to his cousin Flora Darkow (who had emigrated to the United States), and in a language -- with expressions such as "the unprecedented mendacity of the American press, the filthy deluge of defamation [Schutzfluth der Verläumdung]" (34) -- that are surprisingly colorful in comparison to the customary staid prose of the philosopher.

Yet by the war's end Husserl would sign the public post-war appeal of Romain Rolland, "For the Independence of the Spirit!" Rolland was a pacifist and critic of German militarism who consistently stood against the war from the beginning. Husserl's name now appears alongside other consistently staunch critics of the war (and Germany's conduct in it), such as Albert Einstein, Henri Barbusse, and Hermann Hesse (42).

Rolland's plea echoes Husserl's own theme of spiritual renewal, so important for his later thought, and virtually becoming programmatic in the articles written for the Japanese journal Kaizo in 1923 (44-45). In the introduction to these essays, Husserl gives expression to the growing skepticism of those returning from the front:

With a deep aversion against the idealistic activity of war rhetoric, and even with a stronger mistrust of the philosophical, religious, and national ideals placed at the service of war propaganda, this youth largely returned home. They wanted to emerge from the inextricable confusion of truth, pious lies, insolent slander, genuine and adulterated ideals and feelings. (47)

This is a skepticism that Husserl himself came to share, as did Stein and Löwith, in ways that both shaped their respective biography and intellectual itinerary post-1918.

An illustrative example of such a confusion of truth and pious lies is the manner in which the battle of Langemarck, one of the earliest engagements in the first Battle of Ypres in August of 1914, became a German national myth. The battle itself, part of the "race for the sea" in which in the Germans attempted to cut off Allied access to northern Belgium and thus reinforcement by ship, was a confusing, intense, high-casualty engagement characteristic of the early weeks of the war of movement. Its mythologization began with a dispatch from the German OHL describing a battalion of young recruits storming French positions at Langemarck singing the Deutschlandlied, and emerging victorious. In reality the engagement was with the English, took place at the less Teutonic-sounding Bixschoote, ended inconclusively, and it is unlikely anyone was singing anything.[2]

The broader battle did, however, involve a reserve regiment of young recruits from Göttingen, many of them students, including Husserl's two sons, Gerhardt and Wolfgang. Husserl, like virtually everyone else, closely followed news from his sons at the front, and relayed information to other members of the family, principally brother Heinrich living in Vienna (23). Gerhardt's description of the battle in a letter home from 1914 is far from the tropes of the mythical heroism of German youth: "We found ourselves in a genuine sausage kettle on the 21st, which was for our battalion a disaster. Gunfire from occupied houses and artillery caused great damage. The horrible thing was, we could not defend ourselves at all, because nothing could be seen of the enemy" (63-64). The heavy involvement, early in the war, of reserve battalions composed of poorly trained volunteers was a factor in the steep losses of the first weeks of the conflict, the enormity of which had begun to sink in by the end of the year, as expressed by a letter from Husserl to Fritz Kaufmann on Christmas Eve of 1914: "A lot of noble blood has flowed! With deep sadness I especially remember our Göttingen battalions of the 233rd and 234th, where a major part of our student body fights or rather fought! What now remains of it!" (170)

The story of the military service of Husserl's sons is, like countless others, one of loss, sacrifice, and suffering. Wolfgang was wounded in the lung in February of 1915; in 1916, Gerhardt was wounded in the head. In March 1916, Wolfgang falls at Verdun, at the age of twenty. Late in the war, in 1918, Gerhardt is wounded a second time in the head, leading to loss of vision in one eye. Some of the most moving prose in the volume stems from the complex rites of mourning that families and communities rely upon in times of war. Mass warfare in this respect poses particular challenges to such practices: after Wolfgang's death, as was the case in many of the fallen in the great battles of the war, there was no question of recovering the body. At most, the Husserls had only a rough indication of where their son had been buried, since its location had been confused as the result of a shift in the front lines (90, 97).

It is all-too easy for the discourse on the experience of war to oscillate between an emphasis on expressions of hatred and those of mourning and loss. The risk is to ignore expressions of love and its bonds, without which mourning makes no sense, and hatred is granted more autonomy than is its due. Among the most prominent of such expressions of love in the German experience of the war were the Liebesgaben, "gifts of love" from the home front to the soldiers in the field, the collection and receiving of which constituted an important part of life throughout the duration of the war.[3] There are many references to Liebesgaben throughout the volume: a letter from Husserl to his brother Heinrich, indicating that "Latakin tobacco" cigarettes are particularly appreciated at the front; a postcard from Reserve Regiment 222 to Hedwig Conrad-Martius, thanking her for a parcel; a promise to Emil Lask, serving in the field, from his mentor Heinrich Rickert that "the desired chocolates will of course be sent to you from my wife with pleasure" (246); and an effusive thanks from Adolf Reinach to the Conrads from November 1914: "the cigars arrived in perfect condition and they tasted beyond comprehension" (252).

Though at times tempered by love, the situation gradually became one of increasing despair, some of the most striking expressions of which were penned by Husserl, so for example in a 1919 in a letter to Winthrop Bell:

Perhaps there's still a little to hope for. Not much. The daily news reports, the terribly progressing sickness of the German soul and the physical lingering infirmity of the scarcely tolerable famine provokes even new bouts of despair. We are so far that Bolshevism no longer scares us seriously. We hardly have anything to lose. (127-128)

Bell was a Canadian doctoral student of Husserl's who, a victim of the paranoid hysteria at the outbreak of the war, was interred briefly in Göttingen, then in a prisoner of war camp outside of Berlin (120-121). He was a member of the Göttinger philosophische Gesellschaft, which included a mix of well to lesser known figures in the early phenomenological movement. This group as a whole suffered dramatically, losing much of its key membership to the fallen, including Rudolf Clemens, a student of Husserl who fell at Langemarck in 1914; Waldemar Conrad, who volunteered as a medical orderly and died of pneumonia in 1915; Fritz Frankenfurther, who also fell at Langemarck in 1914; Adolf Reinach, who fell at Dixmuiden in 1917; and Emil Lask, one of the few who did not fight on the Western Front but instead in Galicia, fell in 1915.

Through all the carnage, the group managed to produce some important literature on the war, some of it deeply philosophical, some of it more political or even religious in tone. The most well-known -- notorious is probably more accurate -- is Max Scheler's 1915 Genius des Krieges und der detusche Krieg. Composed at the outbreak of the war in 1914 and published the following year, Scheler's work represents an uneasy synthesis of philosophical reflection and the national enthusiasm of the moment. Other examples of war literature from this group include the 1918 draft of a dissertation by Fritz Kaufmann, "Conflict," composed during his time at the front but never defended; Reinach's 1916 draft of a manuscript titled "Phänomenologie der Ahnungen" (259); Kurt Lewin's 1917 Kriegslandschaft, a contribution to the phenomenology of landscape; Hans Lipps' Der Soldat des letzten Krieges (1915); Dietrich Mahnke's 1917 Der Wille zur Ewigkeit (a book much praised by Husserl); and the far more politically oriented work of Arnold Metzger, Phenomenology and Revolution (1919).

It is impossible for the reader to peruse this material without at times seeing it through the prism of subsequent history, not only of the destiny of the world, but of the fates of those who lived through the war of 1914-1918. The editors are aware of this, and provide us with some signs and indications of the future, all of which influence how we understand what we read and see here. This future brings with it its own horrors and traumas. Stein will convert to Catholicism and enter a Carmelite convent in 1938, and will be murdered at Auschwitz. Metzger's prediction, in a 1916 letter to his mother, of a post-war wave of anti-semitism in Germany stands out with particularly morbid prescience (205). Heidegger's future career as a member of the NSDAP hangs over the brief glimpses one catches of him in this volume. He is not alone under this particular cloud: the philologist Friedrich Neumann, a member of the Göttinger philosophische Gesellschaft, who also fought in Reserve Regiment 234 with Husserl's sons, will also join the NSDAP and become the rector of another German university during the destruction of yet another generation of Europe.

This is a remarkable book. The curatorial and editorial strategy deployed does not seek to fuse these materials into some overarching narrative or explanation, but lets them speak for themselves, without any undue expectation that what they say will make complete sense. The book instead collects the fragmentary, archival remains of a group of individuals grappling with the impact of a disaster that took years to unfold, and in which much remained misunderstood, unspoken, and undecided, both during and after. Anyone seeking to better understand the philosophical legacy of classical phenomenology in light of the historical context of the First World War will find in this volume an invaluable resource.

[1] See Ernst Piper, Nacht über Europa. Kulturgeschichte des ersten Weltkriegs (Berlin: List, 2014), p. 222.

[2] See Piper, Nacht über Europa, pp. 88-94.

[3] See Alexander Watson, Ring of Steel: Germany and Austria-Hungary at War, 1914-1918 (London: Penguin, 2014), pp. 210-226.