Philosophers in the Republic: Plato's Two Paradigms

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Roslyn Weiss, Philosophers in the Republic: Plato's Two Paradigms, Cornell University Press, 2012, 236pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780801449741.

Reviewed by Allan Silverman, The Ohio State University


This is an unusually challenging book. Most readers will find something to disagree with, but most I think will also find some insight into the Republic that perhaps they had not appreciated. Weiss is a close reader of the text, and she is admirably respectful of the literary, historical, and philosophical brilliance of the Republic. She is confident that she is not creating interpretations out of whole cloth. 'The modest aim of this book is to show that Plato's Republic contains two distinct and irreconcilable portrayals of the philosopher. That this is so is something of which I am deeply confident.' (1) Now that there are multiple portrayals of philosophers in the ten books of the Republic, or of non-philosophers for that matter, is not especially controversial. That the portrayals are irreconcilable is another matter. For this can call into question the unity of the argument of the dialogue as well as Plato's authorial intent, whether that be dramatic or philosophical. About this Weiss admits: 'I am less sure, however, of why this is so: it is one thing to read a text, quite another to read the mind of its author.' (1)

According to Weiss, there are at least four types of philosophers presented in the course of the discussion especially of the middle books, and possibly two more if we count Socrates as a distinct type and the philosophic dog as a sixth. But the critical distinction for her is the philosopher by nature, presented briefly in Books Five and Six, who remains true to philosophy to the end, and 'a new breed of philosopher fashioned so as to combine within himself both philosopher and warrior.' (11) This is the (type of) philosopher most of us are familiar with, the philosopher who is subject to the choice of whether to descend and rule. According to Weiss, this philosopher, and the Kallipolis as a whole, is not Plato's ideal city or philosopher, but is rather a construct fashioned to meet the demands, or to satisfy the tastes, of Glaucon (and to a lesser extent Adeimantus). The distinction between the true philosopher and the new breed of Book Seven is the most challenging aspect of Weiss's book.

Let us turn first to philosophers by nature. They make their appearance in the third wave at the end of Book Five 473c. To them by their very nature, phusis, belong the study of philosophy and political leadership (474c). They pursues without distaste every study and cannot get enough of learning. These philosophers love truth and pursue what completely is: the transcendent Forms. Only these philosophers by nature, Weiss insists, will be able to possess both the intellectual and moral virtues. (kakeina kai tauta-485a (her citation)) Not only are these virtues compatible with one another, 'they both attach necessarily to the genuine philosophic nature.' (18) In her first footnote Weiss announces that she will pay scant attention to the Republic's metaphysics: Forms, the Good, the Divided Line. So while perhaps it is unfair to complain here, it is not clear how we are to regard her distinction between the intellectual virtues and the moral virtues, in what sense compatibility could be at issue, and what she means by 'attach necessarily to the genuine philosophic nature.'

Moreover, it is not clear that moral virtues are referred to at all at this juncture. The philosophers, with their 'eyes on the absolute truth', 'always with reference to that ideal and in the exactest possible contemplation of it establish in this world also the laws of the beautiful, the just and the good, when that is needful, or guard and preserve (phulattein) those that are established.' (Shorey translation, modified) These, not the 'blind', are to be appointed guardians (phulakes), provided that they do not fall short of others in experience (empeiria (485d)) and are not second to them in any part of virtue. Glaucon affirms that they would have to choose them as guardians, 'provided that they were not deficient in those other respects, for this very knowledge of the ideal would perhaps be the greatest of superiorities. Then what we have to say is how it would be possible for the same persons to have both qualifications' (kakeina kai tauta-485a). It does not appear to be the moral and intellectual virtues under discussion, but the abilities to establish and to preserve laws, to manage the state as it were. That Plato uses the term phulakes also seems to suggest that we are not far from the guardians developed in Books Two and Three, though Weiss is correct in noting that these folks were not identified as philosophers or individuals whose very nature leads them in pursuit of the truth and the Forms. Finally, and perhaps most significantly, as Shorey notes, the empeiria at 485d seems to be picked up at the conclusion of Book Seven (539e), when Socrates is summarizing the argument concerning Weiss's distinct philosophical type, the fashioned philosopher of Book Seven.

Weiss's reason for wanting to distinguish these two types of philosophers is that only the Book Six true philosophers actually pursue justice for justice's sake, i.e., have the virtue of justice. On her reading of the argument, the rule by philosophers was initially no part of the plan for the new city (42). The philosophers who emerge at 473 are briefly given more character at 500, after the ship of state passage. These true philosophers will willingly rule and in ruling will endeavor to promote justice in the state, not the justice of psychic harmony, but rather the traditional virtue that is other-regarding. They rule out of a concern for the interests of others, not themselves. These natural philosophers of course have to meet with an appropriate environment and survive the temptations and avoid the misadventures that can befall the gifted even in a reasonably well-run city. (Those who do not constitute a second type of philosopher. Those who are charlatans are a third type.) But these philosophers by nature, Weiss emphasizes, arise by chance, not by training or by being fashioned by founders. (Rep. 502)

In her second and third chapters Weiss argues that the philosopher of Book Seven, the person who completes the fifteen years of scientific training and fifteen years of political administration before coming to knowledge of the Good, is designed by the founders to play a role in a state that is to Glaucon's liking. These philosopher-warriors are appetitive by nature. In discussing their development, she notes, Socrates distinguishes the moral and intellectual virtues (518ff). These designed rulers have the intellectual virtue of phronesis but lack the moral virtues (65-67). Because they are appetitive, they must be trained to cut their ties to the material world and the pursuit of pleasure. And while they succeed in severing these mundane ties, the fact is, Weiss insists, they are never said to love philosophy -- they have no intellectual eros. Unlike the philosophers by nature, whose moral virtues come as a by-product of wisdom (83), these 'hard men', trained in bodily virtues suitable to the warrior, miss out on the true moral virtues.

Socrates holds out no hope that Republic Seven's philosophers will be decent (epieikeis) or good (agathoi); at best they will be courageous, moderate, and magnificent -- qualities that suit warriors…Indeed, although justice is mentioned ten times in Book 7, the only time it is used for the philosophers is when Glaucon calls them just men. (her italics, 81)

They do not care about the citizens, i.e., they do not have an other-regarding virtue. Rather they are compelled to rule the city so that they may continue, to the degree circumstances make possible, what they appetitively desire, to remain in contemplation as much as they can. In support of this reading Weiss effectively examines the weakness of the founders' arguments (519dff ) that somehow the philosophers owe it to the city to descend, or that the law guides their decision. (See especially 98-107.)

In her two final chapters, Weiss addresses two topics not typically encountered in books on the Republic, Socratic Piety: The Fifth Cardinal Virtue (4), and Justice as Moderation (5). Socrates as a philosophic type or as a philosopher must be marked off from the four types established in the earlier chapters. According to Weiss, Socrates likens himself to the small band of philosophers of Book Six (496a-e) who, for a variety of reasons, cannot enter politics. Seeing the awfulness of politics, they end up taking shelter from the threat of corruption. But he is unlike them: 'Socrates chooses not politics per se but a certain form of political life, a life of being "a busybody in private". . . sugges[ting] that his philosophic practice is better than theirs, indeed that he exhibits a virtue greater than theirs.' (132) That virtue turns out to be piety, which Plato calls attention to by excluding it from the list and by not ascribing it to the any of the philosophers. If, says Weiss, it is an estimable virtue, 'then the possibility must be entertained that there is some other "ruler'" that he [Plato] prefers to any of those outlined in the Republic -- a pious one. Who else but Socrates fits the bill?' (135) Socrates exhibits piety in his devotion to others, in laboring in unfavorable conditions on behalf of the souls of others. In doing so he exhibits piety, coming to the aid of the god by coming to the aid of justice. (141)

The final chapter is devoted to the role of the city-soul analogy in the accounts of justice in the Republic. Weiss notes that for all the work that Plato does in developing the tripartite soul and the internal account of justice in Book Four, the subsequent books are 'oblivious' to this philosophical breakthrough. The reason is that Glaucon and Adeimantus know that justice essentially involves concern for others. Hence they need some kind of account that makes it reasonable for one who can avoid it nevertheless deliberately to choose it. Book Four is written precisely for those who think that 'profitability is sole measure of worth.' (168) The device Plato hits upon is the city-soul analogy and the surprise is the account of moderation. We expect moderation to be the virtue of the appetitive part and the laboring class. Instead, moderation involves all three parts/classes and becomes virtually indistinguishable from justice. (174) The back and forth over bypassing an account of moderation and then developing an account of justice that makes it so similar is deliberate. First, Glaucon and Adeimantus can easily recognize that moderation clearly benefits one. In this manner they can be satisfied as to why one should pursue this strange version of justice. On the other hand,

By failing to carve out for justice any distinctive role or definition, and by insisting nonetheless that justice is a fourth and distinct virtue, one that brings into being and preserves all the others, Socrates causes us to suspect that justice as it really is may actually be missing from the current discussion, and that we would therefore do well to look beyond it to find a justice that is both significantly different from moderation and all the other virtues, and arguably the most important one, rivaling the others for the title "most valuable virtue" (433c) inasmuch as it is the virtue that engenders and preserves the rest. The only justice that can satisfy these two criteria is one that is directed outward to one's fellow men, one that has regard for the interest of others. (179-80)

Of course only the ephemeral true philosophers of Book Six have this virtue (besides Socrates). Almost the entire Republic, then, simply does not examine justice, the other-regarding virtue. As to why this is so, recall, she is less sure. That this is so, Weiss is confident. I am not. Nonetheless, I recommend Philosophers in the Republic to all who struggle to unlock the intricacies of the greatest of Plato's dialogues. Though I struggle at times to see how she comes to some of her main conclusions, on each topic Weiss never fails to illuminate.