Philosophers Without Gods: Meditations on Atheism and the Secular Life

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Louise M. Antony (ed.), Philosophers Without Gods: Meditations on Atheism and the Secular Life, Oxford University Press, 2007, 315pp., $28.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195173079.

Reviewed by George I. Mavrodes, University of Michigan


This book is a collection of twenty independent, freestanding essays, apparently all written especially for this volume. The twenty authors, all evidently professing atheists, are professional academic philosophers. Two of them work at British universities, and the rest are associated with American institutions. David Lewis, of Princeton University, died in 2001 (before finishing the paper included here). So far as I know, all of the other authors are still living.

This collection strikes me as an excellent example of how comprehensible philosophical writing can be at its best. By and large, the essays are written in a clear and direct style, free of philosophical jargon. Most of them can readily be understood, it seems to me, without requiring anything near a professional level of knowledge of the history of philosophy, or of technical logic, or anything of the sort. And many of the essays display a level of passion that is not common in academic writing. These authors, by and large, are writing about something that concerns them deeply. And I think that many who read it will find themselves also engaged at a level that is not merely academic.

Many Christians who read these essays (and I hope that many of them will read them) may find themselves recognizing a genre with which they are already familiar in Christian literature. A lot of these essays are, at least in part, personal narratives. They are "testimonials" -- how I became an atheist, what atheism means to me, what it's like being an atheist, how I get along without God, how atheism has improved my life, etc. And those of us who are on the other side of the table -- we Christians, or other theists -- may look to see whether we can recognize ourselves in the pictures that are here drawn of the religious life that some of these authors have left behind. It is useful to be reminded of the fact that atheists too have their testimonies, and their life stories

Some others of these essays, however, deal with more general topics -- the role of reason and rationality in an atheist or a religious life, the question of whether the available evidence favors atheism over belief in God, the prospects for morality without God, how thoughtful atheists and thoughtful theists can (or should) engage with each other on an intellectual level, etc. In this review I will deal mainly with a few papers of this latter sort. I am a professing Christian myself, so it will be no surprise if my discussion has a noticeable critical orientation. But I hope that I can avoid an unreservedly critical stance, and I would be glad if my comments here serve to whet an appetite for some of the interesting and provocative issues that come up in this volume.

I begin with the biblical story of Abraham and Isaac, a story that has engaged the interest and attention of several of the authors here. I think that all those who discuss it at any length treat it as a tale in which morality loses out to religion (or to God). Here I will make a couple of comments that might be useful to keep in mind. They introduce a theme to which I will return later in this review.

1. A significant feature of the story as we have it in Genesis is that Isaac doesn't get killed. There is indeed a divine command for Abraham to sacrifice Isaac. But Isaac is not killed. No human being gets killed. In fact, God is represented as going to some pains to see to it that Isaac is not killed. It would seem plausible, to me at least, to infer that, as this story goes, God did not intend for Isaac to be killed, and he did not want Isaac to be killed.

But God did indeed command Abraham to kill Isaac. Often, perhaps usually, a command is linked to the corresponding desire and intention. But that is not a necessary or universal connection. It is only prima facie. And the failure of that connection is not idiosyncratic to this episode, or to divine commands. It is not really hard to find cases in which a human commander issues a genuine command, but he would be disappointed (or worse) if the thing were actually done.

Some people think that intention and desire are important elements in judgments about morality. If so, it would be worth keeping that in mind when considering this account.

2. What was Abraham thinking as he undertook the journey with Isaac to the intended place of sacrifice? The story as we have it says very little explicitly about that. No doubt Abraham intended to make the sacrifice, if it came to that. But one response that he is represented as making to a question from Isaac suggests at least that he may have been hoping (hoping against hope?) that in the end it would not come to that. However that might be, Abraham might also have been in the throes of a terrible dilemma.

It is quite possible, or so it seems to me, that Abraham's dilemma had morality on both sides of it. Abraham may have been deeply committed to the conviction that the slaughter of an innocent child is morally abhorrent. Maybe there would have been a terrible tug in his heart to say "amen" to Stewart Shapiro's claim (in this volume) that "it is patently obvious that the immorality of slitting the throat of an innocent child would override any belief that a morally divine deity has commanded someone to do just that." But against that terrible tug to side with Shapiro's judgment Abraham may also have felt another terrible tug, that of his loyalty to God. And maybe he also believed that in God morality had its deepest root and home.

So. Abraham made the dreadful journey with Isaac, taking along (as Isaac noticed) the fire starter and the wood for the sacrifice, but no sheep or goat. Shapiro says

the issue here is whether the level of faith demanded of an Abraham, or anyone else for that matter, is compatible with entertaining doubts about the authenticity of the source of the faith… . Even the slightest inkling of doubt would have been sufficient to stay Abraham's hand.

Would it? Maybe. But I suspect that Abraham may have had many a second thought about whether it was really God who spoke to him, or whether he had correctly understood the divine command. However, maybe Abraham also was not fully and immovably convinced that he himself was infallible about basic morality. Maybe it even occurred to him that the general moral prohibition against killing might have moral exceptions (just as Elizabeth Anderson observes in her long footnote #1), and he might not take himself to be absolutely infallible in picking out all those proper exceptions. In Abraham's heart it may have been tug against tug, and also doubt against doubt. As the story is written, it seems that in the end it was the pull of the divine voice, maybe along with the thought that this voice came from the deepest root of morality in all the world, that won out. He had the knife in his hand when God spoke to him again.

And speaking of doubt, I wonder if Stewart Shapiro ever has doubts, "even the slightest inkling of doubt," about the moral judgments that seem "patently obvious" to him. If he ever does have such doubts they don't seem to surface in his article here.

I turn now to discuss David Lewis' vigorous and provocative paper, "Divine Evil." But I must begin with a caveat.

At the time of his death in 2001 Lewis had begun work on this paper, writing at least an outline of it, and he had discussed it with Philip Kitcher and Michael Tooley. But Lewis did not finish the paper. After Lewis' death, the paper was put into final form by Kitcher, working from Lewis' outline and his conversations, etc. And that is the paper that appears in this volume. But I have no way of knowing just what is clearly due to Lewis himself and how much is due to Kitcher. So with that warning, in this discussion I will attribute the elements I discuss simply to Lewis. (See Kitcher's note on p. 242 of the volume.)

Lewis begins by making it clear that he does not intend to produce still another refinement of what he calls the "standard argument" from evil. That line of atheistic argument begins with some premise about the evils in the world -- the forest fire, the tsunami, the Gulag, the holocaust, or some more limited personal tragedy, sorrow, or crime. These are evils that God did not prevent. But Lewis intends to develop a "simpler argument," an argument that he says has been "strangely neglected." This argument will "start instead from the evils God himself perpetrates."

Lewis has, however, something to say about the standard line of argument, and what he raises is an important issue about the whole project of philosophical argumentation. He says that the most ambitious versions of the standard argument "claim that the existence of evil is logically incompatible with the existence of an omnipotent, omniscient, and completely benevolent deity." That is indeed a strong and ambitious claim, and it has been the subject of very vigorous philosophical critique in the latter part of the 20th century. Lewis, however, says that in his judgment "the most ambitious version succeeds conclusively. There is no evasion, unless the standards of success are set unreasonably high." So, what are the proper standards for success in a philosophical argument, and what would be an unreasonably high standard?

The most ambitious standard arguments are presumably intended to be deductive arguments. We might suggest, therefore, that no such argument could properly be counted as a success if it is logically invalid, or if it involves a false premise. That is indeed a high standard (I will call an argument that meets that standard a "sound" argument). Lamentably, many philosophical arguments fail to meet that standard. But perhaps Lewis would not think that this standard is unreasonably high. And maybe he thinks (as some of us do not think) that many published versions of the ambitious standard argument from evil are sound arguments.

The unreasonable standards to which Lewis alludes, however, seem to be about something other than merely the logic and truth in the arguments. They are standards about what kinds of premises are legitimate. Lewis says that the critics of the standard argument from evil (he mentions Alvin Plantinga) will not allow the use of any "disputable" premises. But Lewis apparently thinks that there are in fact no indisputable premises for any argument. According to him, philosophers are such an ornery bunch that they will dispute anything at all. So the requirement that a successful philosophical argument should appeal only to indisputable premises is an unreasonable standard.

Lewis is here raising an important issue. He does not explore it further, but perhaps we can think about it a little more.

Suppose that a committed atheist has the ambition of producing an argument for atheism -- i.e., an argument whose conclusion is "God does not exist," "there is no god," or something of the sort. But this atheist will not be satisfied with just any old argument. He wants to produce an argument that will satisfy some high standard of excellence, and which then can reasonably be counted as a success. And suppose the standard that he imposes on his own ambition is simply that of producing a sound argument, in the sense of "sound" described above, a sense defined purely in terms of truth and logic. Well, OK.

Or maybe not OK, after all. The fact is that the project described in the preceding paragraph cannot be one that is difficult to achieve. That is, it cannot just be hard to do. Either it is trivially easy for the atheist to satisfy the standard proposed there, or else it is absolutely impossible. If it is at all possible for the thing to be done, then almost surely it has already been done many times over in the long history of philosophical thinking about God. And if by some strange chance it has not already been done, then any atheist sophomore who has taken a course in logic might as well do it some morning before breakfast, and then he can turn his attention to some more demanding pursuit, like stamp collecting.

Consider the following argument (which I am happy to give to any atheist who wants it):

1. Either no tree grows in Brooklyn, or there is no god.

2. A tree grows in Brooklyn.

3. Therefore, there is no god.

This argument is logically valid (disjunctive syllogism). And if atheism is the truth about the world, then the conclusion of the argument is true. Atheism also guarantees the truth of the first premise. And the second premise is also true (presumably regardless of atheism). So, if atheism is true, then this is a sound argument, and so it must satisfy my hypothetical atheist's professed ambition.

If, on the other hand, atheism is in fact false, then the argument given above is unsound (its first premise is false). And the conclusion of that argument, being simply a re-statement of atheism, is also false. But if atheism is false, then (given the definition of "sound") there simply cannot be a sound argument for an atheist conclusion. There is nothing special about atheism in that. No amount of logical sophistication, no diligence, no research, no burning of the midnight oil, can succeed in producing a sound argument for a false conclusion. So, if a committed atheist really does have just the ambition I described above, then he might as well satisfy himself with the argument I formulated above, or something similar of his own invention, and then go on to do something else. If that argument doesn't do his job, then no argument will do that job.

And, of course, just the same sort of thing can be said about a theist whose ambition is merely to produce a sound argument for the existence of God.

This consideration leads some philosophers (I'm included) to think that a reasonable standard of success in philosophical argumentation must include something more than just the soundness of the argument. Soundness may well be a necessary condition of success, but that standard alone is not high enough. There must be something else, and often that something else is taken to be some further restriction on the premises.

Lewis seems to suggest that Alvin Plantinga may be one of "the faithful" who impose an unreasonable standard on atheistic arguments. But he does not specify here just what unreasonable standard Plantinga imposed. In 1967, however, Plantinga did set out a very high standard for theistic (not atheistic!) argumentation. Introducing a study of the classical arguments for the existence of God, Plantinga wrote:

What the natural theologian sets out to do is to show that some of the central beliefs of theism follow deductively or inductively from propositions that are obviously true and are accepted by nearly every sane man (e.g., some things are in motion) together with propositions that are self-evident or necessarily true … And I think it is evident that if he succeeds in showing that these beliefs do indeed follow from those propositions, he succeeds in showing that these beliefs are rational. (Alvin Plantinga, God and Other Minds, p. 4)

That paragraph may be a little vague, but the general idea seems pretty clear. According to Plantinga, the legitimate premises for natural theology must not only be true. They must be self-evident or necessarily true, or else obviously true and (almost) universally accepted by sane people. And that is a pretty high standard indeed.

I think that Plantinga once said, or wrote, that nothing of any importance had ever been proved in philosophy. Maybe he was just having a bad hair day when he said that. But maybe he was completely serious. And, given the standard proposed above, he would very probably have been right. Maybe no philosophical argument -- theistic, atheistic, or any other -- meets that standard.

I don't know whether Lewis ever suggested that Plantinga was being too hard on the natural theologians, setting an unreasonably high standard for success in proving the existence of God. But given Lewis' own view of the cantankerous streak in philosophers, it looks as though he might well have made that suggestion. It might have been a good thing for the philosophy of religion if Lewis and Plantinga could have gotten together to work out a reasonable standard for successful philosophical argumentation, a standard that could be applied both to theistic and atheistic work. But I don't know of their ever having done that.

Anyway, back now to the "neglected argument" that Lewis really wants to push in this article. For the main premise of that argument we can skip any reference to the stock list of natural and moral evils in the world, the evils that God does not prevent. "We might start instead," Lewis says, "from the evils God himself perpetrates. There are plenty of these, and, in duration and intensity, they dwarf the kinds of suffering and sin to which the standard versions allude." And Lewis' own favorite example of these evils seems to be hell. Hell, according to him, is an enormous evil that God does not merely tolerate. God himself perpetrates hell.

Now, on the face of it, it is pretty hard to imagine a less promising premise for an atheistic argument. For the premise would seem to be flatly incompatible with the desired conclusion. If God does not so much as even exist, then it would seem really implausible to think that God could manage to send anyone to hell, even for a weekend. An atheistic argument of that sort would seem to be one whose conclusion could be true only if its main premise were false. And such an argument would seem to fail even the most minimal reasonable standards for philosophical success.

Of course, someone may reply that Lewis did not really mean to say that God sends people to hell, thus perpetrating a great evil. He must have meant to say only that some people claim that God sends sinners to hell, that some religions have that doctrine, or something of that sort. And perhaps that is indeed what Lewis really meant.

That generates a striking difference between Lewis' neglected argument and the standard versions of the atheistic argument from evil. The latter characteristically do not cite religious texts, or the writings of theologians, to support the premise that there really are gulags, forest fires, terrible diseases, and the like in the world. But Lewis does not claim that his premise about hell is just a plain and obvious fact about the world, like a forest fire. Instead, he cites more scriptural verses than a bible-thumping radio preacher would read in a month of Sundays. And he even throws in a few suras from the Qu'ran. His line of argument, unlike the standard versions, is unavoidably parasitic on religious sources.

Lewis' argument, therefore, should not be construed as a properly atheistic argument. It is, at best, an anti-religion argument. And it is not even anti every religion. Lewis himself says that his argument has no bite against something he calls "deism." It is, at best, an argument against religions (or theological positions, etc.) that include a doctrine of hell of the sort he describes.

Religions, however, characteristically involve a complex of claims. Suppose that the existence of hell (at least if it has an actual population) is incompatible with the existence of an omnipotent, loving, fully benevolent God, etc. In that case it would be plausible to think that there is something wrong with a religion that includes all those claims about God and that also includes a commitment to the reality of hell. There would be some mistake in that religion, some falsehood. And a person who had that religion might take that really seriously. She might undertake to resolve the incompatibility by giving up one of the elements involved in it. So she might give up the existence of God, and become an atheist. And that might be a move serious enough to lead to her giving up the religion altogether. Or she might try a compromise more moderate than outright atheism, giving up instead one or other of the strong claims about the divine attributes, character, etc.

She might, on the other hand, give up the existence of hell. Perhaps she will become a universalist, believing that in the end God will succeed in drawing every person to Himself, enfolding them in the divine love. The alleged incompatibility of God and hell, if it is real, can be resolved in any of several different ways. And these different ways do not all entail atheism. The alleged incompatibility itself is neutral with respect to these different modes of resolution.

However, I do not want to gloss over the difficulties that will probably accompany anything like the universalist resolution, and maybe some of the other possible compromises. Those who opt for such a way out may also have to make some adjustments in their ways of thinking about the authority and reliability of canonical texts such as the Bible, the role of traditional and historical creedal statements, the status of religious authorities such as bishops, and so on. Personally, I would love to see some of the theologians of my own church undertake a response to the issues that Lewis raises here.

One of the most interesting papers in this volume, for me anyway, is Richard Feldman's "Reasonable Religious Disagreements." Feldman wants to argue that while there certainly are religious disagreements, there cannot be any reasonable religious disagreements. Where two people really have a genuine and serious disagreement about some religiously significant proposition -- one of them believes that it is true, for example, and the other one thinks that it is false or he suspends judgment about it -- then one or both of these people must be acting unreasonably.

Put in this unrestricted way, the thesis seems very implausible, but Feldman puts forward a principle that he calls "The Uniqueness Thesis."

This is the idea that a body of evidence justifies at most one proposition out of a competing set of propositions (e.g., one theory out of a bunch of exclusive alternatives) and that it justifies at most one attitude toward any particular proposition. As I think of things, our options with respect to any proposition are believing, disbelieving, and suspending judgment. The Uniqueness Thesis says that, given a body of evidence, one of these attitudes is the rationally justified one.

If The Uniqueness Thesis is correct, then there cannot be any reasonable disagreements in cases in which two people have exactly the same evidence.

As Feldman well recognizes, the Uniqueness Thesis (UT) does not imply that there are no reasonable disagreements. It implies only that there are no such disagreements between people who have the same body of evidence.

It may not be clear how the UT might apply to a case in which two people have conflicting attitudes toward some one proposition, and neither of these people has any relevant evidence at all about that proposition. In a trivial sense, I suppose, those people have exactly the same evidence, i.e., none at all. And some people might say that in the absence of evidence these two people should neither believe nor disbelieve that proposition. They should withhold belief. So if they were rational they would not here have a disagreement.

There are, however, philosophers who hold that human beings could not have any rational cognitive life at all unless it were rational for them to believe some propositions without evidence. This idea is often put in terms of some sort of architectural, foundationalist, picture of a rational cognitive structure, something like a building with many levels. Maybe for a finite knower at least, that structure will have some lowest level. The beliefs at the lowest level -- the "basic" beliefs as they are sometimes called -- might constitute evidence for higher-level beliefs, and so they would evidentially support those higher-level beliefs. But there would not be any still lower level beliefs to support the basic beliefs.

Some have claimed that there is only a single, small set of beliefs that can be "properly" basic, or only a very restricted set of types of properly basic beliefs. If so, then maybe no two people could properly, rationally, have conflicting beliefs at the basic level. But not everyone accepts those restrictions, and some prominent philosophers of religion have held that some religious propositions -- e.g., some significant propositions about God -- can be properly basic, even though they are not universally accepted. If that is so (I'm inclined to think that it is so), then disagreements at this level would constitute exceptions to the UT.

Feldman, I think, does not consider this sort of case at all. Here I will say no more about it. We can, however, take the UT to be a somewhat restricted principle, one that applies to evidentially based beliefs. And there it has at least some initial plausibility. But, of course, it has an application only to cases in which the people involved have the same body of evidence.

Feldman thinks there is no problem involved in two people rationally disagreeing about a single proposition if they have different evidence. And he thinks that there can easily be cases in which two people can rationally have different evidence, one having evidence that justifies believing a certain proposition, and the other having evidence that justifies disbelieving that very same proposition. So they could have a rational disagreement, perhaps even about some significant religious belief.

However, if they were to share their evidence, then each of them would have that combined body of evidence. And the UT says that this combined body of evidence rationally supports one, and only one, of Feldman's attitudes -- belief, disbelief, or withholding belief. If they continued to disagree, then one of them, or maybe both, would be irrational.

Well, OK. But is it possible for people to share their evidence to form a combined body of evidence? What would such a sharing consist of? How could it be done? Is it realistic to think that it could be done in cases of really significant and interesting differences, maybe even in cases of religious differences? Feldman does take those questions seriously.

Well, how could two people share their evidence? I think that Feldman has only one suggestion to make about that. "When people have had a full discussion of a topic and have not withheld relevant information, we will say that they have shared their evidence about that topic."

That seems to me to be rather unrealistic. How would it apply, for example, in a case where each person has fully disclosed all of his relevant information and evidence, but the other person simply does not believe him? But I will not pursue this problem here.

Feldman does consider the suggestion that a person might have evidence that could not readily be put into words. And at one point he seems to think that a "private religious experience" might belong in that category. In my opinion, his discussion of that topic is not clear, and I'm not sure that I understand it. I will not try to summarize it here. But he does introduce an interesting hypothetical case of conflicting beliefs, each supported by experiential evidence, to illustrate how he might treat such a disagreement. I think we might indeed learn something from Feldman's story, and I will end this review with a brief discussion of it. Here is the story, in Feldman's words:

Compare a more straightforward case of regular sight, rather than insight. Suppose you and I are standing by the window looking out on the quad. We think we have comparable vision and we know each other to be honest. I seem to see what looks to me like the dean standing out in the middle of the quad. (Assume that this is not something odd. He's out there a fair amount.) I believe that the dean is standing on the quad. Meanwhile, you seem to see nothing of the kind there. You think that no one, and thus not the dean, is standing in the middle of the quad. We disagree. Prior to our saying anything, each of us believes reasonably. Then I say something about the dean's being on the quad, and we find out about our situation. In my view, once that happens, each of us should suspend judgment. We each know that something weird is going on, but we have no idea which of us has the problem. Either I am "seeing things," or you are missing something. I would not be reasonable in thinking that the problem is in your head, nor would you be reasonable in thinking that the problem is in mine.

This is, of course, a hypothetical case. It is a piece of fiction. I have nothing against it on that account. It seems to me to be fully "realistic," in the sense that there really could be a real-life situation like this, one that involved actual human beings, perhaps a friend and me. But there is also a sense in which it strikes me as being very unrealistic indeed.

It is important to note that this piece of fiction is written in what is sometimes called the "omniscient narrator" mode or style. The narrator knows all about all the characters -- what each of them is doing, what is happening to them, etc. And this includes knowing what is going on in their heads -- what they know, how things "seem" to them, what they believe, etc. And if we are to enjoy the story, and to be carried along by it, then we accept what the narrator tells us. It is, after all, his story to tell.

But I think that Feldman also invites us to imagine ourselves as one of the characters in this story. Let's accept that invitation. I will try to tell you how that works out in my case. You can compare that with what happens when you try that invitation.

In Feldman's story I seem to see the Dean, standing in the Quad. OK, that could happen to me. No problem. And I can imagine that I form a corresponding belief about the location of the Dean. No problem there, either. But at the next stage something funny happens, and it does generate a problem.

Feldman tells us that the other character (i.e., my friend) sees nothing in the Quad. If I were simply a reader of Feldman's story, that would be no problem at all. He is the omniscient narrator after all, and he can say what is happening in that character's head. But if I am imagining myself as a character in the story, that is a different matter. I, as a character in a real life situation of this sort, would not have a magical pipeline into my friend's head, a window that would allow me to perceive directly how things seem to him. And I would not have an omniscient narrator to tell me what is going on in my friend's head, how things seem to him. How then do I come to have a belief about how things seem to my friend? Ordinarily, I would have to get that from something that my friend says to me.

And how will I get an idea of what my friend says about things like that? Again, I don't have an omniscient narrator to tell me what my friend is saying. I have to get in touch with my friend's speech by hearing it.

Feldman evidently thinks that the weird situation throws the evidential value of our visual experiences into doubt. Apparently one of us is having a visual hallucination. Well, of course, that seems to be a possibility. But, to me anyway, it seems entirely arbitrary and unrealistic to fasten upon that as the only possibility. When I read Feldman's story, anyway, I thought immediately that the weird situation could be generated by auditory hallucinations as readily as by visual ones. Maybe I badly mis-hear what my friend says about the Dean and the Quad. Or he mis-hears what I say. In that case we would have conflicting beliefs, but they need not be about the Dean. Maybe we have the very same beliefs about the location of the Dean, but conflicting beliefs about what was said in our conversation.

Feldman, of course, is telling a story about visual hallucinations. But if I were living out that story I would not know that it was about visual hallucinations. From my point of view, within the situation, it would look just as well to be a story about auditory hallucinations. Feldman suggests that I should suspend my belief about the Dean. But that seems arbitrary. Why should I not rather suspend my belief about my conversation with my friend? Or maybe I should suspend both sets of belief?

And there is another possibility. Maybe my friend is lying about what he seems to see. Of course, in the story Feldman says that I know my friend to be honest. But in a real life weird situation that belief might be shaken. And in that version of the weird scenario we need not have any conflict of belief at all. Maybe Feldman's weird situation puts everything up for grabs, maybe every belief and every judgment must be suspended. And then, where do we go from there?

It looks to me, therefore, when I actually try to imagine living through a weird situation of the sort that Feldman suggests, that his own conclusion is unrealistic and arbitrary. A lot more is up for grabs than he allows. Disputed beliefs and evidence morph into one another. Maybe the disagreement that was supposed to generate the weird situation is itself an illusion.

Maybe if you also try to imagine living through something like Feldman's story you will share my sense of the arbitrariness of Feldman's own treatment of it. And that may well be something to remember if we want to take seriously some claims about religious experience.