Philosophical and Scientific Perspectives on Downward Causation

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Michele Paolini Paoletti and Francesco Orilia (eds.), Philosophical and Scientific Perspectives on Downward Causation, Routledge, 2017, 333pp., $140 (hbk), ISBN 9781138195059.

Reviewed by Stuart Glennan, Butler University


Much has been written in the past twenty-five years on the topic of downward causation -- enough that one might wonder if we need another volume devoted to the topic. But Paolini Paoletti's and Orilia's anthology, comprising eighteen chapters from European and American metaphysicians, philosophers of mind, philosophers of science, and scientists, offers a good sense of where things stand together with some interesting suggestions on how to move forward.

The book is divided into three parts -- "Downward Causation and the Metaphysics of Causation," "Downward Causation and the Sciences," and "Downward Causation, Mind and Agency." The divisions are somewhat arbitrary; for instance, issues of mind and agency show up in the first section, and clearly metaphysical arguments show up in the second. Broadly, though, the essays in the first and last section of the book take a more metaphysical approach, which sees downward causation (and related concepts of levels and emergence) as general features of the world, whereas the papers in the middle section analyze putative cases of downward causation in the special sciences. In what follows, I shall describe some of the general and metaphysical accounts, before turning to the more scientifically motivated ones.

Many of the essays map the terrain of downward causation in light of two formative moves from the 1990s. The first is Mark A. Bedau's (1997) account of the distinction between weak and strong emergence. Weak emergence is a particular articulation of a kind of epistemological emergence -- cases where the properties and behavior of complex systems arise from the interactions of their parts, but where their behavior cannot be predicted except by simulation. It is, as Bedau says, "metaphysically innocent." By contrast, strong emergence is ontological emergence -- where a mereologically complex whole has causal powers that supervene upon its parts, but which are truly novel, and which can exert downward causal influence on its parts. Emergent properties are understood to be different from merely "structural" or "resultant" properties, which arise in a predictable way from the arrangement and relations between parts. Bedau believes strong emergence has little empirical usefulness or support and is "uncomfortably like magic" (Bedau, p. 377)

The second move, even more central, is Jaegwon Kim's causal exclusion argument (Kim 1993; 1998; 1999). Kim's views on properties, events, emergence, supervenience, and causation, have largely set the terms of the debate. Like Bedau, Kim is deeply suspicious of downward causation. The causal exclusion argument, discussed in several of the volume's papers, is roughly this: If a higher-level event M supervenes on a lower-level event P, and P is causally sufficient for some other event P*, then M cannot also be a cause of P, unless one accepts that there is systematic overdetermination of causes. Kim's principal concern has been with mental causation -- where Ms represent mental events and Ps physical events -- but the argument appears to apply quite generally to any higher level properties and events. One is left with a dilemma -- either identify higher-level properties and events with their microphysical bases, or live with epiphenomenalism.

One way out of this dilemma is simply to give up on an ontologically robust sense of top-down causation. Some of this book's authors are happy to do so. John Heil advocates such an approach, arguing against the very notion of levels, and higher-level properties. Heil's essay is a succinct advertisement for his metaphysics (2003; 2012), which feature a levels-free ontology with sparse properties and a powers-based view of causation. Heil argues that when scientists (as opposed to philosophers of mind and non-reductive physicalists) speak of levels, they have chiefly in mind compositional levels, where wholes are at a higher level than parts. But Heil believes that these complex objects are in the end nothing more than their parts, suitably arranged. This means that while there are many useful predicates we may use in describing these complexes, there are not higher-level objects and properties, because the truth-makers for claims using these predicates are simply facts about the basic objects, their properties and arrangements.

A less radical approach to attacking Kim's dilemma is to take issue with the approach to causation and laws implicit in Kim's approach. Max Kistler does this through the lens of difference-making, and specifically, James Woodward's (2003) interventionist account. If one can intervene on higher-level variables to make differences in lower-level variables, one has, it appears, a case of top-down causation. This is not a new idea, and it has been explored by Woodward himself (2015) among others. Kistler's aim is to show how, within such a framework, epiphenomenalism is avoided, and also how "the empirical content of a downward causal statement differs from the content of the corresponding lower-level causal statement" (p. 63). Kistler explicates this difference by use of a concept he calls "specificity," an approach that recalls Stephen Yablo's (1992) classic strategy for defending mental causes.

Simone Gozzano provides a useful counterpoint to Kistler's approach. His paper is aimed at exploring the tension between the two desiderata of emergence as identified by Bedau -- that emergent properties derive from underlying processes, and that they are somehow autonomous from them. He observes that counterfactual approaches (e.g., Woodward's) appear to make causation, and with it downward causation, cheap. He suggests that, if such accounts are taken to represent a genuinely ontological view about the nature of causation, defenders owe us an account of the truth-makers for these counterfactuals. For this and other reasons, he concludes that the dependence of emergent properties on micro-structure undermine their capacity for true downward causation.

Several authors reconsider Kim's dilemma in light of a non-Humean powers ontology. In their contribution, Orilia and Paolini Paoletti suggest that a weak form of downward causation can be bought if one adopts a tropish rather than Kim-style view of properties and events. Erasmus Mayr expands this line of argument. An Aristotelian powers ontology requires us to distinguish between causal powers, and the "characteristic change processes" involved in the manifestation of those powers. He argues that powers, including higher-level powers, can be causally relevant, even though their manifestations supervene on lower-level events.

Rani Lill Anjum and Stephen Mumford also use a powers framework to attack the problem of emergence, but they aim to use this framework to explore more directly the ways in which causal powers (strongly) emerge. They advocate what they call a "causal-transformative" view of emergence, where what distinguishes emergent causal powers of composites from mere structural or resultant powers is that they arise from causal processes that transform the parts. "Emergent powers of wholes cannot then be mere aggregates because those parts themselves change, losing at least their qualitative identity, in order to enter into that whole" (pp. 98-9). Anjum and Mumford have in mind cases such as the development and impact of language in social groups. Language capacities cannot be had except in groups, and participation of individuals in a group with language will transform the individuals within the group. Anjum and Mumford's view is interesting in part because it rejects an important feature of the standard setup for emergence debates, which suggests that emergent properties supervene on base properties. Emergence in Kim's and most other accounts is something non-causal and synchronic. On Anjum and Mumford's view emergent properties don't "arise" from activities of their parts, but are diachronically caused by them. It is in this respect similar to "non-standard" views offered by Paul Humphreys (1997) and Timothy O'Connor and Hong Yu Wong (2005).

Mario De Caro and Matteo Grasso, in "Three Views on Mental Downward Causation," consider the prospects for yet another approach to causation that can provide a robust but naturalistic account of mental-to-physical downward causation. After considering challenges to both Davidson's anomalous monism and the strong emergentist programs of O'Connor and Lynn Baker, they defend what they call an "intentional causation" view, which they take from Anscombe and Putnam. The central feature of these accounts is a deep causal pluralism that ties causation to explanation. Such an account prevents exclusion arguments from getting off the ground by blocking worries about causal overdetermination; there is no one kind of causing, and hence no privileged micro-causal story to exclude higher level (including mental) causes.

Sophie Gibb's essay does not offer an answer about how (or if) mental causes can have physical effects, but it does provide a useful counter to a familiar move in the mental causation literature. As she puts it, "even if one accepts . . . [that] mental causes are identical with physical causes, there are still worries about whether the mentalness of the mental cause or the mentalness of the mentalness of the mental cause is causally redundant in the physical domain" (p. 265). Such worries she calls qua problems, as they are, e.g., worries about a mental/physical cause, qua mental, and she argues quite persuasively that they are not genuine problems, in the sense that if you truly accept mental-physical identities, they do not arise.

Carl Gillett's contribution is situated in the book's second "scientific" section, but it would fit just as well or better in the first section, as its ambitions are clearly metaphysical, even if strongly informed by reflection on particular scientific cases. In it, he tries to square his belief in strong emergence with his skepticism about downward causation. Gillett believes the downward causation discussion has been hampered by a failure to distinguish the non-causal and synchronic "vertical" relation of composition with the causal and diachronic relation of causation. Part of his paper is devoted to articulating the problems of using causal criteria for determining compositional relations -- in particular, as it occurs in Carl F. Craver's (2007) mutual manipulability account. He then describes and defends an account of a non-causal downward determination relation between wholes and parts that he calls machresis. The rough idea is that wholes downwardly constrain or shape the roles of their parts, at the same time as the parts fill roles in the whole. And because the parts are so constrained, they have different powers than they otherwise would, creating a kind of "indirect" downward causation.

The chapters in the second section focus on putative cases of emergence and downward causation in particular sciences -- physics, chemistry, biology and neuroscience. The first two chapters form an interesting contrast. In the first, physicists Stewart Clark and Tom Lancaster argue for an instrumentalist interpretation of top-down claims in condensed matter physics. Physicists seek to understand the macroscopic properties of condensed matter (e.g., metals) which are, from a quantum-mechanical point of view, many particle systems. Calculating the properties of such systems is intractable without the introduction of approximations using techniques such as mean field theory and density functional theory. These techniques show how the values of micro-level variables can depend upon macro-level variables. An implication of this is that manipulation of these macro-level variables can produce micro-level changes. But in the authors' view, this does not show us anything about genuine top-down causation, since those variables only approximately measure aggregate properties of the microstate.

In the second of these chapters, Robin Hendry takes a very different view. He believes that reductions of chemistry to physics systematically fail, and that, accordingly chemical substances and their properties are frequently strongly emergent. He considers two questions: whether chemical substances reduce to physical entities via theoretical identities (like "water = H20"), and whether molecular structures are reducible to systems of particles behaving in accordance with the laws of quantum mechanics. One example he considers is whether chemical substances can be reduced to physical substances via their molecular formulas. He argues that the identity fails, because aggregating molecules changes the aggregates and gives them new properties. For instance, pure liquid water will always have some concentrations of distinct chemical species -- not just H2O, but also the ionized forms H3O+ and OH-. Moreover, these ions are essential for accounting for some of liquid water's properties. He also argues that important features of molecular structure cannot be captured by Schrödinger equations. A key point of dispute between Hendry and the authors of the previous chapter concerns the degree to which the use of approximations to characterize aggregates undermines claims about the reality and powers of those aggregates.

Marta Bertolaso and Marco Buzzoni offer a plea for a more pragmatic understanding of levels of mechanisms in biology. Craver's (2007) account of levels says that two entities are at the same level just in case they are components of the same mechanism, and that when entities are not related to each other in a mechanism, it does not make sense to make judgments about their relative level at all. Bertolaso and Buzzoni are not against the spirit of this account, but argue that certain objections to the account can be addressed if one adopts an agency theory of causation, in the sense of, e.g., von Wright (1971) and Menzies and Price (1993). While I agree there is much to be said for a pragmatic turn in thinking about levels (Glennan 2015), the authors have more work to do to show that this particular approach to causation is necessary to achieve that goal.

Luciano Boi defends downward causation from the perspective of systems biology. Drawing on work of Dennis Noble, Boi argues that biological systems exhibit strongly emergent properties, because these systems have novel causal powers that their parts do not. But while Boi claims that the properties describe by systems biology are strongly emergent, it is not clear that they are anything more than weakly emergent in Bedau's sense. While the causal powers Boi points to are indeed novel, they are not obviously different from structural or resultant properties -- properties that may be very important, but do not pose ontological puzzles. One may be left with the impression (which one also gets in Noble's work) that the points made, while welcome ripostes to reductionist and especially genetic determinist views, can be accommodated with weaker senses of emergence.

Bill Bechtel's contribution offers a novel approach to understanding top-down causation in biology and neuroscience that appeals to concepts of controllers and controlled systems: "a controller is at a higher level than the system it controls, and if something is controlling the controller it is at a yet higher level" (p. 202). Examples of the kinds of relations Bechtel has in mind are transcription factors that regulate gene expression, or circadian clocks that regulate a variety of metabolic functions. On Bechtel's analysis, systems are control systems when they can redirect Gibbs free energy flowing through that system by altering constraints on the system. This account would explicate the sense in which neurons control muscular function or the pancreas helps control blood sugar concentration in the bloodstream. Bechtel emphasizes that there are many levels of control within biological systems, controlling processes within cells, organs and larger systems. And while Bechtel does not explore the matter, it seems that this analysis could be fruitfully applied in a variety areas -- for instance, in ecological, technological or social systems.

There are three chapters, which I have not yet mentioned and which, for various reasons, are not well integrated with the main themes of the book, or at least with my reconstruction of them. In her contribution, Anna Marmodoro makes a case for neo-Aristotelian ontology she calls powers structuralism. With a few exceptions this is a work of analytic metaphysics that is little connected with discussions of levels and downward causation in philosophy of science and philosophy of mind. François Jouen and Michèle Molina's essay is about knowledge acquisition in early human development -- essentially on the innate/acquired distinction -- and has little discernible connection to the book's themes. (It is also about material this reviewer does not feel competent to comment on.)

The last of these three chapters is by Uwe Meixner, who outlines a theory of agent causation. In one sense the contribution is a good fit for the volume, as it does address the nature of mental causation. But at the same time, the paper is very far removed from the traditions of metaphysics and the philosophy of science that are recognizable in the other essays. Meixner rejects event causation entirely and argues that all causation involves choices by conscious monads. While I expect many readers would, like me, find some of Meixner's positions and arguments difficult to accept or even understand, reading the essay provided a helpful reminder of the degree to which philosophical debates like the ones highlighted in this book start from a set of presuppositions almost invisible to their participants, but which outsiders might easily question.

What should we make of this volume as a whole? Certainly there is no magic bullet here; nothing in these essays, by themselves, will resolve a set of issues that have made the emergence and downward causation discussions so intractable. But still there are lessons to learn here. Though far from perfect, the essays by and large try to foster a conversation between metaphysics and philosophy of science, to the benefit of both fields.

Reflecting on the papers in this volume, my own conclusion is that we may be best served by stopping looking for the one thing that is the relation of emergence or downward causation. The essays offer a variety of different accounts of how wholes depend (causally or otherwise) upon parts, and parts depend upon wholes. Part of the problem of standard setups where one seeks to distinguish "genuinely novel" from "merely" structural and resultant properties, is that it denigrates the richness and variety of ways in which organized collections of parts --mechanisms, as I like to think of them (Glennan 2017) -- can give rise to new causal powers. Emergence (and with it downward causation) may not be one thing, but many.


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