Philosophical Essays Volume 2: The Philosophical Significance of Language

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Scott Soames, Philosophical Essays Volume 2: The Philosophical Significance of Language, Princeton UP, 2009, 461pp., $39.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780691136837.

Reviewed by Cara Spencer, Howard University



Scott Soames’ Philosophical Essays, Volume 2 collects sixteen of Soames’ previously published articles on propositional attitudes, modality, truth and vagueness, and skepticism about meaning. Many are classics, and all reward close reading. While about half of them are readily available online, the comprehensive introduction and the excellent editorial selection makes the volume well worth buying. The articles themselves are tightly focused, and contain little to sell the reader on the intrinsic interest of the problems they address or the wider implications of their solutions (though Soames hints at the latter in the introduction). The articles share a few core commitments. First among these is the Russellian view of propositions, according to which a proposition is a structured object whose structure corresponds to that of the sentence expressing it. Soames also comes to the defense of Saul Kripke’s central conclusions in Naming and Necessity: that proper names and natural kind terms are rigid designators, that necessity is metaphysical rather than linguistic, and that some necessary truths are therefore known a posteriori, and some contingent truths known a priori. Soames thinks that many of our mistakes as philosophers of language arise from our failure to appreciate these conclusions, and our collective relapse into the familiar comforts of descriptivism. He also lays some of the blame for this at Kripke’s feet, first for using some bad arguments that continue to feed the relapse, and second for ignoring the carefully drawn distinction between necessity and a priority in his case for skepticism about meaning.

Soames divides the essays into four sets, the first of which takes up problems about propositions and propositional attitude ascription. In Essay One, “Direct Reference, Propositional Attitudes, and Semantic Content,” Soames undercuts the identification of what a sentence says with the set of worlds or situations in which it is true. He argues that the identification can’t be reconciled with two natural ideas: (1) propositional attitude verbs express a two-place relation between an agent and a proposition, and (2) proper names, indexicals, and demonstratives are directly referential. For Soames, the solution to the puzzle is that the possible worlds approach to content has to go, and it should give way to the structured proposition picture. The rest of the essays in this section consider objections to this view, and show how it fits within a Fodor-style language of thought approach to content.

The second set of essays, on modality, begins with an essay on Kripke’s modal argument against the description theory of proper names. The modal argument observes that a proper name N and a definite description the F typically differ in modal profile even if N is actually the F, and concludes that N is not semantically equivalent to the F. Soames runs the modal argument against two variants of the description theory that are alleged to account equally well for the semantic data. The next two essays in this section take up the problem of the necessary a posteriori, which for Soames is the problem of explaining why we need empirical evidence to justify a necessary truth. Consider your desk, which let’s suppose is actually made of wood. You need empirical evidence to determine the necessary truth, about that very desk, that it is not made of metal. Empirical evidence generally lends support to a claim by ruling out genuine metaphysical possibilities in which that claim is false. But there are no possible worlds in which your desk is made of metal, hence none for empirical evidence to rule out. So such evidence must play a different role here. In "The Philosophical Significance of the Necessary A Posteriori" Soames offers two explanations of its role. The first story, which Soames favors, says that the proposition that your desk is made of wood, although true in every metaphysically possible world, is false in some epistemically possible ones. The role of empirical evidence is to rule out those merely epistemic possibilities. The second story about the justificatory role of empirical evidence, which Soames rejects, says that the evidence rules out metaphysically possible worlds in which our sentences mean something different from what they in fact mean. On this story, empirical evidence shows us that our expression “this desk” refers to a desk made of particle board, rather than a distinct desk that is actually made of metal; in effect it rules out the possibility that we are talking about a different desk. In “Knowledge of Manifest Natural Kinds,” Soames gives an account of de re knowledge of necessary truths about manifest kinds that complements the first story about the role of empirical evidence in justification.

The next two essays in this set, on two-dimensionalism, blame the second story for motivating a metalinguistic account of content that Soames believes is implicit in many two-dimensional accounts of content. “Understanding Assertion” criticizes Robert Stalnaker’s two-dimensional account of assertion content, on which (1) the goal of an assertion is to rule out possibilities that the conversational context leaves open, and (2) assertions determine two propositions, either one of which is available to provide its content. For Soames, Stalnaker’s picture can’t account for the content of assertions of de re belief because it leaves no room for merely epistemic possibilities. “Ambitious Two-Dimensionalism” broadens the attack on two-dimensionalism to include the semantic program of David Chalmers and Frank Jackson, both of whom he accuses of reviving a host of failed doctrines, specifically descriptivism and linguistic accounts of necessity and a priority. The section’s final essay, “Actually,” raises and solves the following paradox about the “Actually” operator: Whenever s expresses a truth, Actually s is true in every epistemically possible world. And since it is true in every epistemically possible world, empirical evidence cannot (at least not by Soames’ lights) play any role in establishing it. Yet the only way to learn that Actually s is true is by learning that s expresses a truth, and in many cases that requires empirical evidence. Soames resolves the puzzle by denying that learning s is the only way to learn Actually s. We can be presented with the actual world in the usual way, by being acquainted with it, or by description (in the same way that we could be presented with merely possible worlds). Possessed of a complete description of the actual world, we could infer a priori that Actually s is true. Since there is an a priori route to knowledge of Actually s, the puzzle dissolves.

The third set of essays considers truth and vagueness. “What is a Theory of Truth” defends Tarski’s theory of truth and explains its limits, and “Understanding Deflationism” offers a more general defense of deflationism about truth. The next two essays consider a problem for a familiar view that Soames among others has defended — the view that vague predicates are partially defined. A predicate P is partially defined if its application conditions determine both a class of objects to which it applies (the extension) and a class to which it fails to apply (the antiextension) where the two classes are disjoint but do not cover the entire universe of discourse. The problem for this view is that it forces us to say something intuitively wrong about the predicate determinately P when P itself is partially defined. Since the application conditions for P specify an extension, an antiextension, and a nonempty set whose members are not included in either, it seems that determinately P could not be partially defined — it would apply to everything in P‘s extension, and not apply to everything else. But this seems intuitively wrong. The predicate determinately bald seems just as vague (and therefore just as partially defined, on this analysis) as bald. This is the problem of higher-order vagueness. Soames’ solution is that determinately P can be partially defined if P is, but the range of cases to which it neither applies nor fails to apply is narrower for determinately P than it is for P. “The Possibility of Partial Definition” defends the partial definition view from an objection due to Michael Dummett and Michael Glanzberg. Dummett and Glanzberg argue that the view runs afoul of the constitutive links between truth and correct assertability. They say that if an object o is in neither the extension nor the antiextension of P, then it is incorrect to assert that o is P. But it is incorrect to assert p if and only if p is false. So it follows that p is false, not undefined as to its truth-value as Soames would have it. Soames replies that replacing the truth norm of assertion with a knowledge norm solves the problem.

The final section contains two articles on skepticism about meaning and intentionality. “Skepticism about Meaning: Indeterminacy, Normativity, and the Rule-Following Paradox” considers Kripke’s arguments for meaning skepticism and argues that they confuse a priori consequence and necessary consequence. Soames agrees with Kripke that there is no set of facts (about a speaker’s past use of “+”, or his or her disposition to use it) from which we can a priori infer that the speaker meant plus by “+.” But as Soames notes, meaning facts could still supervene on these facts. The second essay, “Facts, Truth Conditions, and the Skeptical solution to the Rule-Following Paradox,” takes a cue from George Wilson to temper the oddness of Kripke’s skeptical solution. For Soames, nothing Kripke says shows us that there are no meaning facts in a minimal sense of “fact,” according to which it is a fact that s iff s. Rather, Kripke shows us something weaker, that a certain conception of meaning is incorrect. On this conception, a sentence is meaningful because it has a certain truth condition, and a speaker’s grasp of this truth condition is conceptually prior to his or her understanding of the sentence. Soames thinks this conception is unattractive for independent reasons — it just gets things the wrong way around. For Soames, a speaker’s linguistic competence explains his or her linguistic understanding.

All of the foregoing is too cursory to display the richness and depth of these essays. For that, I recommend you just read them. They are well worth your while. That said, I have reservations about a notion that does some heavy lifting for Soames in several of the essays: the notion of an epistemically possible world-state. Soames is not the only philosopher to embrace this notion, so problems for the notion are not his alone.1 Soames invokes them to launch his arguments against Stalnaker’s account of assertion and to frame his Kripkean account of the necessary a posteriori. If there is no good way of making sense of merely epistemic possibilities, then both fall short.

Let’s start with Soames’ account of what they are. For Soames an epistemically possible world state is a "maximal, world-constituting property that we can coherently conceive to be instantiated, and that we cannot know a priori not to be instantiated" (281). Soames explains these maximal properties by appealing to Carnap’s notion of a state description. For Carnap, a state description is a complete and consistent set of atomic sentences and their negations, relative to which we can determine the truth-value of every complex sentence composed of those atomic sentences. On Soames’ variant of Carnap’s picture, the atomic sentences are replaced by “structured Russellian propositions expressed by atomic formulas, relative to assignments of objects to variables” (281). For any such complete and consistent set of Russellian propositions, there is a maximal property of a world that makes every proposition in the set true. These properties are world states. Thus the actual world state is the property the universe actually instantiates, metaphysically possible world states are properties the universe does not instantiate, but could have, and merely epistemically possible world-states are properties the universe could not have instantiated, though we cannot know this a priori.

So Soames thinks there are necessarily uninstantiated world states according to which my wooden desk is made of metal. Consider one such world-state, w. If w had been instantiated, then there would have been a metal desk in my office, and this desk furthermore would have been my desk — the same desk I have in my office now, which is made of wood. w is distinct from another possibility, w*, which is just like w, down to containing a metal desk in my office, except that this desk is not mine. So there should be something that distinguishes w from w*, something about desk in w that marks it off as being my desk. It would be a mistake, as Soames notes, to say that what marks it off must be a qualitative feature. To insist on that is effectively to insist on descriptivism. But there still should be something about this desk that makes it the case that it is my desk, even if it is not a qualitative feature. The problem is that it doesn’t seem like there could be anything at all, qualitative or not, that marks off this metal desk as my wooden desk.

Now Soames would say that an important lesson of the new theory of reference is that we can single out objects and think about them directly, so we don’t need to identify something about the desk in w that marks it off as my desk. We don’t need to demonstrate that the desk in w really is my desk. All we need to do is decide to talk about my desk. That decision ensures that the world-state at issue is one in which the metal desk is mine. For Soames, this is all just like saying that when we wonder whether Aristotle was fond of dogs, we don’t need to demonstrate that the philosopher we are thinking about really is Aristotle. We don’t need to specify what marks that philosopher off as the actual Aristotle. It is enough to just decide to talk about him. That decision alone guarantees that our thought hones in on Aristotle.

My worry here is that the two cases are not analogous. There are possible worlds in which Aristotle was fond of dogs, so we can use these worlds to characterize what we are wondering. But there are no possible worlds in which my wooden desk is made of metal, so a world-state according to which the desk in my office is made of metal is a fortiori a world in which the desk in my office is not the same desk as the wooden one I have in there right now. It couldn’t be. In embracing merely epistemic possibilities, Soames doesn’t have to somehow make them into genuine metaphysical possibilities. But that doesn’t free Soames from an obligation to say what they are. In this case, this means that Soames should have some story to tell about how a world-state, even an impossible one, can make it true that the wooden desk in my office is made of metal.2


Chalmers, D. (forthcoming) “The Nature of Epistemic Space”. In A. Egan and B. Weatherson, eds. Epistemic Modality. Oxford UP.

Salmon, N. (1989) “On the Logic of What Might Have Been”. Philosophical Review 98: 3-34.

1 See for instance Salmon (1989) and Chalmers (forthcoming).

2 Thanks to Scott Soames and Amato Nocera for helpful comments and discussion.