Philosophical Foundations of Criminal Law

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R. A. Duff and Stuart P. Green (eds.), Philosophical Foundations of Criminal Law, Oxford University Press, 2011, 543pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199559152.

Reviewed by Anthony M. Dillof, Wayne State University Law School


One does not have to read far to be engaged. By its very title, Philosophical Foundations of Criminal Law confronts the reader with challenging questions: Does criminal law have a stable underlying explanatory structure that can be characterized as "foundational"? If so, is it sufficiently deep, rigorous and conceptually interesting to be "philosophical"? After all, criminal law has developed organically over hundreds of years in response to a range of very basic societal needs and shifting political and cultural forces. In this respect, criminal law is not very different from funerals, farming, folk dancing, and fashion. Accordingly, finding philosophy at criminal law's core would be a noteworthy discovery.

Reasonably, the editors of Philosophical Foundations of Criminal Law do not claim any such scoop. Rather, they are quick to explain that the title of the book was not so much self-selected for its accuracy as chosen by its publisher for consistency with other works of the Oxford Press (2). Of course, there is plenty of room to debate the meaning of "philosophical" and "foundational," and both the editors and a number of contributors opine on the aptness of these terms to criminal law. Suffice it to say that the twenty-one essays of Philosophical Foundations demonstrate that even if criminal law is not a subject resting on philosophy, it is at least an area of potential philosophical interest and theorizing. Indeed, the essays are organized around four strands of theory: (1) criminal law as it relates to political theory, (2) the substance of criminal law, (3) process and punishment, and (4) international and future criminal law.

Philosophical Foundations of Criminal Law, however, is not principally intended as a systematic treatment of these four topics. Rather than assigning discrete subtopics to writers, the editors asked the group of well-known criminal theorists to submit original essays and organized the results as best they could into coherent topics. As a result, there are no essays explicitly on the relation of criminal law to liberalism, justification and excuse, and the limits of criminalization, and only one on theory of punishment. Furthermore, many (but not all) of the contributors, rather than presenting and defending the central theoretical claims they are known for, use their essays as a vehicle to elaborate on aspects of those claims. The collection thus likely will compliment, rather than replace, somewhat more systematic works already in existence, such as The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Criminal Law.

Mindful of the difficulty of doing justice to the rich offerings of Philosophical Foundations, below I briefly discuss some representative essays of the collection.

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"Criminal Law and Political Theory" is the first part of the collection. Through criminal law, society authorizes the use of force to ensure compliance with its rules. Criminal law is perhaps the most salient feature of statehood. Accordingly, when it comes to the criminal law, questions of legitimacy -- central to the concerns of political theory -- loom large.

In "Criminal Law as Public Law," Malcolm Thorburn challenges the recently popular legal moralist view of criminal law. According to this view, the criminal law, epitomized in the criminal trial, is a means of measuring a citizen as a moral agent responsible for his acts. Consequently, justification defenses serve as a means for accused citizens to assert that their prima facie wrongdoing was morally justified. Thorburn's disagreement with legal moralism is based on this underlying theory of the state. Thorburn argues that without the state moral action is impossible because such action (for reasons not entirely clear) undermines the actor's status as a moral equal with those around him (42). The fundamental purpose of the state is to circumvent this problem by defining jurisdictional spheres of action, and the criminal law enforces these spheres. Conduct supporting a justification defense, such as burning another's property to create a firebreak, is thus conceived of not as all-things-considered morally justified action, but as permissibly acting outside of one's jurisdiction as a private citizen on the ground that state officials have failed to fulfill their firefighting responsibilities. Thorburn's account therefore succeeds in nicely illuminating certain legal doctrines, such as the imminent harm requirement for necessity and self-defense. It seems to fair less well, however, with other justification doctrines, such as the proportionality requirement for self-defense and the lesser evil requirement for necessity, neither of which constrain state officials operating within their jurisdictional spheres.

In "Republicanism and the Foundations of Criminal Law," Richard Dagger advances a rational reconstruction of criminal law in the republican tradition. According to Dagger, while liberals focus on protecting individual privacy from improper governmental intrusion (liberty from law), republicans focus on promoting active and responsible citizenship in government (liberty through law). It follows that criminal acts are not wrongful merely because they harm individuals of the political community, but also because they also threaten the social stability necessary for self-governance. In this respect, republicanism provides an appealing account of the historic development of the criminal law. But can it explain the criminal law's current scope and structure? Domestic violence, for example, is now understood to be a crucial area for criminal law intercession precisely because all too often it occurs in private without implications for the public at large. Dagger explains the authority of criminal law to employ force as a form of communication based on the free-riding offender's skirting of his burden of compliance (64) (reminiscent of Herbert Morris's fairness theory of punishment). At least in the case of domestic violence, this theory seems unilluminating and only weakly connected to republicanism's central aim of promoting civic virtue.

In "Responsibility for the Criminal Law," Alice Ristroph moves beyond the traditional question of the justification of criminal law and explores the arguably deeper and more difficult question of society's responsibility for the criminal law. Ristroph observes that society is responsible for criminality in two senses: it chooses to criminalize particular conduct and it chooses forms of social organization that lead to or permit such conduct. Such responsibility, Ristroph argues, may impose obligations on society even when these social choices are fully justified. Such obligations may be owed to those who would break the law, as well as to the family and the community of those punished. Family and community all too often bear heavy indirect burdens as a result of the sanctions applied directly to others. Ristroph concludes her essay by stating that a just society "would not dismiss such harms as collateral consequences to justified violence [but would] seek to address those harms, to mitigate them, perhaps to compensate them" (124). This is a valuable insight and highlights the need for a more detailed practical inquiry into whether current measures to address such harms, such as social services and entitlement programs, meet (or exceed) society's moral obligations and whether compensation is actually called for.

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"The Substance of Criminal Law" is the second major topic in the collection. The essays in this part address such familiar questions of criminal law theory as the proper role of character in determining liability, the nature of legal intention, the problem of rules versus standards in offense formulation, and the proper scope of inchoate and preparatory offenses. Douglas Husak's contribution, "The De Minimis 'Defence' to Criminal Liability," however, examines a largely overlooked criminal law doctrine and shows it to be of interest. The core of the de minimis doctrine permits actors who have violated a criminal norm, under circumstances that neither license the violation nor negate the actor's responsibility for the violation, to avoid liability on the ground that the violation was trivial. Casting doubt on the merits of other explanations, Husak notes that criminal convictions carry collateral consequences and posits that a powerful stigma accompanies all criminal convictions. Thus liability for a de minimis violation violates principles of proportionality (350). But such an explanation seems to go too far because it would extend to many violations of very minor offenses, rather than to trivial violations of any offense. A more plausible theory may be that it is unfair for prosecutors to prosecute persons for violations that are so technical that most other similarly situated persons are not prosecuted by prosecutors on those grounds. In this respect, the de minimis defense may share a common moral basis with the entrapment defense.[1]

In "Wrongdoing and Motivation," Victor Tadros seeks to clarify the relation of motivation and wrongdoing through an examination of the famous trolley car thought experiment. Tadros considers the intuitions that it is wrong (impermissible) for A to throw a person in front of the trolley car to save five and wrong (impermissible) for B to steer the trolley car onto another track away from the five for the purpose of killing the one person on it. Rejecting other explanations, he concludes that the motivation of the actor accounts for our intuitions. The validity of Tadros's analysis aside, it is unclear what the significance of it is for criminal law since it appears that the criminal law would impose liability on neither A nor B. At least under section 3.02 of the Model Penal Code, which requires only belief in the existence of the justifying condition, each would enjoy a defense. Tadros admits that criminal law and moral judgments diverge. But it seems that the disagreement here is not a substantive one, but a disagreement whether an act's being "wrongful" is a matter of whether the act may be done or whether the doer would be wronged by punishment for the act. Tadros's argument about the relevance of motivation seems to speak merely to the latter.

The nature of "probability" and its close relations, "chance" and "risk," are a traditional topic of philosophical dispute. In "The Ontological Problem of 'Risk' and 'Endangerment' in Criminal Law," Peter Westen attempts to provide a theory of risk suitable for the criminal law. Westen argues that liability for reckless endangerment requires the creation of substantial agent-independent risks, and that liability for attempts requires the creation of at least some agent-independent risks, despite the dearth of case law to this effect. Westen consistently describes the test for whether such risks exist as whether "judges and/or juries" (324, 325, 326) have a substantial fear or any fear at all that harm of the appropriate type "could have occurred," or "could easily have occurred" (324). On one hand, it seems unusual to pose the test in such a manner because judges and juries generally are not charged with determining whether judges and/or juries fear something. If, on the other hand, the test is simply whether the harm that did not occur could (easily) have occurred, the problem of explicating risk is shifted to the problem of explicating counterfactual operatives such as "could (easily)." Thus Westen seems to abjure analyzing criminal concepts in a manner that ties them to the general utilitarian, retributivist or other well-known aims of the criminal law, but leaves them firmly in the camp of philosophers and metaphysicians.

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The third part of the Book, "Process and Punishment," unites two disparate topics. On the topic of process, Paul Roberts, in "Groundwork for a Jurisprudence of Criminal Procedure," explores four forms of theorizing (doctrinal, epistemological, institutional, and normative) about the procedure and evidentiary rules that implement the criminal law. Reviewing a wide range of literature, Roberts identifies the manner in which criminal procedures seek truth and the extent to which criminal procedures are truth-seeking as the prime areas of philosophical interest. Likewise, Donald A. Dripps, in "The Substance-Procedure Relationship in Criminal Law," distinguishes between approaches to procedure that portray it as truth-seeking (rationalism), in part truth-seeking (pluralism), or minimally concerned with the truth of matters relating to the elements of the substantive law (reductionism). Both essays call for further research by the forms of scholarship they describe rather than championing a single school or defending a (first-order) substantive thesis.

Mitchell N. Berman's essay, "Two Kinds of Retributivism," is the essay with the least connection to criminal law per se, mentioning the term only twice in the introduction section. Berman focuses on the justification of punishment in general without reference to the specific rule violations that persons are punished for. Berman's goal is to illuminate the salient features of retributivist theories of punishment in the context of more general moral categories such as consequentialism and deontology. Berman considers the common retributivist claim that inflicting suffering on culpable wrongdoers is an intrinsic good. Berman argues that such a claim renders retributivism no more than a species of "instrumentalist" justifications for punishment, similar in kind to the nonretributivist claim that inflicting suffering on culpable wrongdoers is justified by the intrinsic good of crime deterrence. In an effort to isolate a more distinctive feature of retributivism, Berman identifies (but does not endorse) the view that justified punishment is response-dependent. A theory of desert is response-dependent if it asserts that what is deserved by a wrongdoing is not merely some unwanted experience, such as suffering or censure, but an appropriate response to the wrongdoing by the appropriate group. While he provides no examples, Berman implies that a distinctive and interesting brand of retributivism would be one that distinguishes between, say, the intrinsically valuable death of a killer resulting from electric chair execution and an equally painful death resulting from a random lightning strike. In this way, Berman, though not directly mentioning criminal law, suggests an important connection between justified punishment and society's rules, structures and institutions.

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Response-dependency is also an element in Christopher Heath Wellman's contribution, "Piercing Sovereignty: A Rationale for International Jurisdiction Over Crimes that Do Not Cross International Borders," a chapter of the final part of Philosophical Foundations. Where a genocidal act is committed by a group in one state against another group in that state, what is the basis for a punitive response by an extra-state body such as the International Criminal Court? Wellman rejects the received view that ICC jurisdiction is legitimate because such acts literally or metaphorically affect humanity as a whole. Instead, Wellman cogently argues that such intervention is legitimate because it neither violates the rights of defendants, who have forfeited them by their wrongful acts, nor the host state, which has forfeited their jurisdictional rights by failing to protect its citizens. This view, which might be described as "international vigilantism," seems to place only prudential restraints on an international body's prosecuting common criminals in failed states such as Somalia. While it is not clear whether Wellman would endorse or resist this result, it appears that such a position would justify a radical expansion of extra-state jurisdiction.

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In sum, Philosophical Foundations of Criminal Law is a collection of strong theoretical essays on some traditional, and some not so traditional, issues of criminal law. Representing Anglo-American scholarship from both sides of the Atlantic equally, it is less a work for the ages than a document of current thinking. Simultaneously illuminating and stimulating, it is less concerned with finalizing the philosophical foundations of criminal law than establishing foundations for future philosophizing about criminal law. And that is a powerful point in its favor.

[1] See Anthony M. Dillof, "Unraveling Unlawful Entrapment," Journal of Criminal Law and Criminology 94 (2004): 827-896.