Philosophical Foundations of Discrimination Law

Placeholder book cover

Deborah Hellman and Sophia Moreau (eds.), Philosophical Foundations of Discrimination Law, Oxford University Press, 2013, 283pp., $98.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780199664313.

Reviewed by Kasper Lippert-Rasmussen, Aarhus University


Discrimination law raises interesting questions in legal and moral philosophy. Most countries have discrimination laws, but what exactly should discrimination laws forbid? And what makes discrimination laws justified in the first place? Despite the fact that discrimination is a hot topic in a wider political context and the fact that more and more complaints about unfair treatment are articulated as complaints about discrimination, currently there is only a surprisingly small, but growing, literature on philosophical issues related to discrimination in general and discrimination law in particular. For that reason, among others, Deborah Hellman and Sophia Moreau's contribution is welcome and much needed. Their book contains contributions by thirteen theorists, all with different takes on the philosophical foundations of discrimination law. So, not surprisingly, it provides an overview of an emerging field but makes no underlying core claims about it. Indeed, the editors stress that one aim of their volume is "to demonstrate that certain questions are worth investigation" (blurb). The book does so in an exemplary manner, and, invariably, the chapters provide interesting arguments for the conclusions their authors advocate. I suspect the volume will become a standard reference in philosophical discussions of discrimination and discrimination law.

The book has three parts. Part I contains various positions on what makes discrimination unfair and what justifies discrimination laws. A central issue addressed in each of its five chapters is whether discrimination is morally wrong because it clashes with the value of equality, or for some other reason. With a qualification, which I will explain shortly, two authors argue in favor of the former position. Hanoch Sheinman defends the moderate position that discrimination against someone is often morally wrong independently of how the discriminator treats others, but that the fact that the discriminator treats the discriminatee worse than non-discriminatees "reinforces" the initial, non-comparative moral wrong. Hellman argues that "as a constitutional conception of wrongful discrimination, we should" see it "as a violation of equality" (p. 51). The other three contributors argue that discrimination is morally wrong for non-equality-related reasons. Denise Réaume holds that discrimination violates an individual's right to be treated with dignity (p. 21). Moreau  reasons that discrimination reduces discriminatees' deliberative freedom, i.e., their liberty to deliberate over not having to factor in certain of their morally irrelevant characteristics, such as race or gender (p. 81). Richard Arneson argues that discrimination fails to maximize overall moral value where that depends on well-being weighted according to how well off and how morally deserving individuals are.[1]

Together the five chapters cover the terrain well, and each makes a case for the position defended that is well worth reflecting on. That being said, I have three comments about Part I. First, at times the issue at hand needs clarification in terms of whether contributors, who appear to think they (dis)agree with one another, actually address different questions. By way of illustration: as noted Hellman seeks to explore the "constitutional conception of wrongful discrimination". But to the extent that what makes discrimination wrong can deviate from how the constitution conceives of what makes discrimination wrong, it is unclear whether she addresses the same question as, say, Sheinman does when he makes claims about the moral "badness/wrongness of conduct in paradigm discrimination cases" (p. 50). An underlying, but if so implicit, assumption of hers might be that the "constitutional conception of wrongful discrimination" is a reliable indicator of the moral wrong of discrimination, in which case Hellman's contribution does indirectly speak to the same issue as Sheinman does. This brings me to my second comment.

Like Hellman, Sheinman thinks that, in part at least, moral complaints about discrimination appeal to equality. However, they do so in quite different ways. As Hellman has explained in detail elsewhere, she thinks the distinctive wrong of discriminatory acts consists in their having a certain anti-egalitarian meaning, to wit, that some are owed more concern and respect than others.[2] For instance, flying the confederate flag over the South Carolina State House is an act that has such an anti-egalitarian meaning. When Sheinman similarly appeals to equality to explain the wrong of discrimination, he has in mind the wrong of "treating the [discriminatee] unwell relative to others" (p. 28). Interestingly, one can violate equality in Hellman's sense without doing so in Sheiman's sense (and vice versa). Suppose that in addition to flying the confederate flag, symbols carrying similar meanings regarding all other racial groups are exhibited at the South Carolina State House. (If you think -- as will become apparent in my remarks about Lawrence Blum's chapter below, at least one contributor to this book is likely to think -- that there are no such symbols, suppose, counterfactually, that there are, even if as a matter of fact there are not, as surely there could have been.) In that case, no citizens of South Carolina are treated well, but none is treated unwell relative to others. What this shows is that there is a difference between treating citizens with equal concern and respect and treating them in a way that carries the meaning that they should be treated with equal concern and respect.

My third comment is that I find some of the arguments offered against equality-based views not very convincing despite the fact that I have elsewhere defended an account that is identical to or (in other work) has considerable affinities with Arneson's desert-catering prioritarian consequentialist account.[3] Take for instance, Réaume's "simple test for whether an essentially egalitarian approach to a distributive question is in operation" (p. 8): is the person who complains about being discriminated against indifferent as to whether, in the future, (1) she will be treated as well as those who are not subjected to discrimination or, (2) those who are not discriminated against will be treated as badly as she? Either way, future discrimination will be eliminated. Yet, Réaume thinks that since "claimants rarely put their claim" in the second way, this suggests that complaints about discrimination do "not directly appeal to equality itself as its foundation, but rather to some other value implicated in the distribution of the benefit in issue" (pp. 8-9). This test strikes me as quite misconstrued. Take the case of discrimination in punishment. Suppose all minority criminals get the punishment they deserve, non-comparatively speaking, while non-minority criminals often get much more lenient punishments. There are obvious, non-discrimination-related reasons why minority criminals, if they complain about discrimination, will argue in favor of their being punished more leniently. However, third parties, including minority non-criminals, might complain about the discrimination against minority criminals and yet prefer non-minority members being punished more harshly to minority criminals being punished more leniently. So here is at least one case where Réaume's test gives different results than those she assumes.

More generally, Réaume's test is flawed, because discriminatees might complain against their treatment for more than one reason, some favoring leveling-up and others (i.e., equality-based ones) being indifferent between leveling-up and leveling-down. Sheinman brings this out well. Réaume, on the other hand, seems to run together the issue of whether one's complaint is solely about inequality and the issue of whether it is fundamentally about equality (pp. 8-9). I should also like to note that, as Réaume concedes, the notion of dignity is vague (p. 21) and needs to be spelled out. One worry here is that to deliver plausible results from the point of view of a moral assessment of discrimination, it must be spelled out in such a way that a person's dignity is disrespected whenever that person is treated disadvantageously relative to others on grounds of belonging to a certain protected category, e.g., sex. If dignity is so construed, perhaps what is really doing all of the moral work, dressed up as dignity, is a concern for equality. This is so, especially if one answers the question "Why is it disrespectful of someone's dignity to treat her worse than others on grounds of her sex etc.?" by saying that it is so, because it is wrong or unfair to do so.

Part II explores two presuppositions made in Part I: i) that discrimination laws form a coherent set of rules and, relatedly, ii) that the "wrong of discrimination" can be reduced to "a single underlying value" (p. 4). On the first issue, George Rutherglen argues that legal anti-discrimination norms "disassociate into a collection of disjointed pieces of legal doctrine that have nothing in common beyond their longstanding association together" (p. 123). If Rutherglen is right, much of the discussion in Part I makes little sense, since there is no reason to expect that "a collection of disjointed pieces of legal doctrine" can be justified, say, by appeal to equality, dignity or deliberative freedom. In a response to Rutherglen, Tarunabh Khaitan offers an interesting account of the necessary and collectively sufficient conditions that a duty-imposing legal norm must satisfy to be a norm of discrimination law (p. 152).

On the second issue, Patrick S. Shin and Lawrence Blum both defend, though in somewhat different ways, the claim that there is no type of wrong such that every act of discrimination is wrong for this reason. Nevertheless, Shin suggests that "the legal concept ascribes the status of discrimination . . . to various forms of action that, if unchecked, would undermine the justness of our basic institutional structure" (p. 181). Blum argues that rather than talking about, say, discrimination on the basis of gender we should talk about discrimination against men or discrimination against women. This is so because the two instantiate "different wrong- or bad-making characteristics" (p. 199), e.g., because of the history of sexism, generally, discrimination against women is demeaning in a way that discrimination against men is not. Similarly, the latter is unlikely to contribute to the subordination of men, where the former might contribute to the subordination of women (p. 188). In other words, "sex discrimination" etc. refer to forms of discrimination that, morally speaking, are quite different.

The discussion of the two main questions in Part II is intriguing. However, on the latter question the discussion would have been clearer if it distinguished between the claim that discrimination is wrong in virtue of certain features that are true of individual cases of discrimination by definition, and the claim it is wrong in virtue of features which are true of many, but not all, individual cases of discrimination, say, that it is demeaning. Undoubtedly, one should be a pluralist in relation to the latter claim, since, like all actions, individual discriminatory acts can be wrong for different reasons (assuming, unlike utilitarians, that there is more than one reason why an action can be wrong). Still, pluralism about what makes discrimination wrong in this sense is compatible with discrimination having only one "wrong- or bad-making characteristic" among those characteristics, which something must possess to be discriminatory. For what it is worth, I do not think that discrimination -- at least defined in a certain way, which captures much of the ordinary language use of "discrimination" -- has such a characteristic. This view is compatible with the existence of a presumption of discrimination being wrong, e.g., because it contributes to stigmatic harms or worsening of opportunities.

Part III addresses some issues in "discrimination law that are currently the topic of considerable public debate" (p. 4). Benjamin Eidelson asks what it means to treat people as individuals, and whether discrimination involves failing to do so. Julie C. Suk considers whether quotas are unjustified, e.g., because they cause "Balkanization". Michael Selmi ponders whether disparate impact theory is theoretically defensible and relevant for contemporary American society. David Wasserman asks if disability discrimination is different from other kinds of discrimination, e.g., race discrimination, because we find it justifiable to seek ways to prevent people from becoming disabled, but not justifiable to seek ways to prevent people from having a disfavored race. The contributions in Part III are more loosely connected to each other than in the two previous parts, although, in her qualified and empirically informed defense of quotas, Suk notes that the Supreme Court opposes quotas on the ground that they "fail to evaluate individuals as individuals" (p. 229).

While there is much to be said about each of these chapters, I restrict myself to a comment on Eidelson's suggestion that one treats another as an individual if, and only if, one i) gives reasonable weight to how this person has autonomously shaped her life in relevant ways and ii) does not disparage this person's capacity to make autonomous choices (p. 216). I find this suggestion very interesting but ultimately mistaken. I think i) and ii) are neither collectively sufficient, nor individually necessary conditions for treating someone as an individual. Let me explain the first claim first. Suppose a person is in a condition where he lacks the capacity to make autonomous choices, e.g., he is intoxicated. A police officer has access to evidence that he is never aggressive when intoxicated -- say, testimony from colleagues -- but ignores it because this person belongs to a racial group whose members the police officer perceives as dangerous. Accordingly, he arrests the intoxicated person using disproportionate force. Suppose that none of the ways that this person has autonomously shaped his life is relevant to the situation, i.e., i) is satisfied. Moreover, suppose that in arresting the person the police officer does not disparage the arrestee's capacity to make an autonomous choice, because being intoxicated he lacks the capacity at the time and because the police officer would have, let us suppose, responded to him as to an autonomous being had he not been intoxicated, i.e., ii) is satisfied. Contrary to what Eidelson's account implies, the arrestee has a complaint about not being treated as an individual.

Consider whether i) and ii) are necessary conditions for treating someone as an individual. Presumably, the notions of giving "reasonable weight to how this person has autonomously shaped her life" and not "disparaging a person's capacity to make autonomous choices" are threshold notions that supervene on something that is a matter of degree. To take the former notion, one can give more or less weight to how a person has autonomously shaped her life, and there is room for variation in how much weight one gives to this factor even once it is clear that i) is satisfied. Assuming this to be the case, it is possible for an agent, say, to treat women as individuals on Eidelson's account and yet systematically give less weight to how women autonomously shape their lives than to how men do so, etc. In such a case, it seems to me that a woman might complain that this agent does not treat her as an individual, but to some extent at least as a member of a certain group. Given that the agent satisfies Eidelson's two conditions the agent might not be acting seriously wrong in doing so, but there is nothing in the notion of treating as an individual that implies that it is always a serious wrong not to treat someone as an individual.

The two previous paragraphs show that on Eidelson's construal of the complaint about failing to treat as an individual, the connection between not treating as an individual and discrimination is loose in the following sense: one can treat someone as an individual and yet discriminate against him, just as one can fail to treat someone as an individual and not discriminate against him -- say, because one treats no one as an individual and does not do so to an equal degree. This loose connection is not a problem for Eidelson. It shows that "Because it involves a failure to treat people as individuals" is not the correct answer to the question "What makes discrimination as such wrong?" But that is entirely consistent with Eidelson's observation that "acts of discrimination are often criticized on the . . . ground that they fail to treat people as individuals" (p. 203) and with the normative claim that in many cases this complaint is justified.

All in all, Hellman and Moreau's book is a very valuable contribution on a topic located in the fertile intersection between philosophy and legal theory. While it grows out of papers presented at two conferences, the different chapters hang together much better than is the norm for such publications. I warmly recommend it to scholars and students interested in discrimination -- its nature (to the extent that it has any), its wrongness, and what should be done about it -- or discrimination law.

[1] The introduction describes Arneson's argument as "utilitarian" (p. 3). But for this description to be true the term must be used in a very loose sense, since, unlike Arneson, utilitarians do not think that a benefit to a worse off person, or to a morally deserving person, is non-instrumentally better than an equal-sized benefit to a better off person, or a morally undeserving person. That being said, it is true that, like utilitarianism, Arneson's view is consequentialist in that he thinks an action is morally right if, and only if, it brings about at least as much good as any alternative action. However, as indicated, his account of what makes an outcome good differs significantly from the one offered by utilitarians.

[2] Hellman D (2008) When Is Discrimination Wrong? (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).

[3] Lippert-Rasmussen K (2013) Born Free and Equal? A Philosophical Inquiry Into the Nature of Discrimination (Oxford: Oxford University Press).